War by Agreement: A Contractarian Ethics of War

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Yitzhak Benbaji and Daniel Statman, War by Agreement: A Contractarian Ethics of War, Oxford University Press, 2019, 215pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199577194.

Reviewed by Saba Bazargan-Forward, University of California, San Diego


There are two assumptions that have guided theorists writing on the ethics of war, since the scholastics and jurists of the late Renaissance and Early Modern periods (from roughly the sixteenth through the nineteenth centuries). First, war is a relation between states (or, more recently, between a state and a collective aspiring to statehood) rather than a relation between individuals. Second, the moral rules governing conduct in war do not depend on the morality of the war being fought. These doctrines form the basis of what has come to be known as Just War theory. Since the turn of the century, however, the doctrines grounding Just War theory have come under sustained attack. According to this new revisionist critique, war is a relation between individuals rather than states. Consequently, individual soldiers who participate in an unjust war cannot absolve themselves of responsibility for what they do by adverting to their role as instruments of the state. Hence, the moral rules governing conduct in war do in fact depend on the morality of the war being fought. This view undermines two mainstays of traditional Just War theory. According to revisionists, 1) the moral equality of combatants is mistaken, and 2) not all civilians enjoy blanket moral immunity from attack.

In their book, Yitzhak Benbaji and Daniel Statman defend traditional doctrines against the revisionist critique. They do so by developing a contractarian view of war. Their argument has two stages. First, they argue that the UN Charter and the Law of Armed Conflict are best understood as contracts between decent states aiming at maintaining peace -- even if that peace maintains an otherwise politically unjust status quo. As part of this contract, states agree to waive their precontractual moral right to use force to achieve certain just aims. They also agree that should a state nonetheless resort to war to achieve such aims, other states reserve a right to respond with defensive force.

In the second stage, Benbaji and Statman argue that legal systems in general, and the war agreement in particular, affect moral permissions and obligations only if the agreement passes certain moral tests. They argue that the UN Charter and the Law of Armed Conflict pass these tests and, as a result, we lose some of our precontractual moral rights and gain other contractual moral rights, which ultimately vindicates the moral equality of combatants and the doctrine of civilian immunity. In what follows I go over their view in detail, and then argue that though this book represents the best attempt in the literature so far to defend the orthodoxy of Just War theory, it falls short of that goal. That being said, up until now no one has developed a sustained and systematic contractarian account of orthodox Just War theory. In doing so, Benbaji and Statman raise insightful and compelling challenges to revisionism -- challenges that its adherents must address. As a result, their book is without a doubt necessary reading for anyone interested in war ethics in general and the revisionist critique of war ethics specifically.

In the version of contractarianism that Benbaji and Statman adopt, agents possess 'precontractual' rights -- that is, rights independent of any political system, which any such system must respect. These precontractual rights include the right to life and to bodily integrity. Agents who freely accept the social rules underwriting a political system implicitly consent to be governed by the state -- that is, the institutions implementing the political system. What does it mean to accept social rules? It means a) adhering to those rules and b) regarding them as normatively binding. (Here, Benbaji and Statman explicitly adopt H.L.A. Hart's account of acceptance. This is a chief weakness in their account, to which I will return). Crucially, social rules are morally binding only if the agents to whom they apply actually accept them. Benbaji and Statman call this the condition of Actuality. This is in contrast to accounts by other contractualists, such as Rawls, who argues that a social rule can be binding even if we don't actually accept the rule. It is enough if we would accept it under ideal deliberative conditions.

Agents will accept a rule, Benbaji and Statman claim, only if such rules are sufficiently good. And rules are sufficiently good only if they satisfy two conditions. First, the rules must be mutually beneficial in that the resulting state of affairs is Pareto-superior relative to one in which the agents rely on self-help to protect their precontractual rights. Second, the rules must not engender unfair or disrespectful social relationships.

By accepting a political system institutionalized in a state, Benbaji and Statman say, the agentsimplicitly consent" to be governed by it. In so doing, the agents waive some of their pre-contractual rights. But they also gain rights that they would not have pre-contractually. In particular, the agents authorize their state to act on their behalf in the international arena. "Hence," Benbaji and Statman say, "if it is fair and mutually beneficial, a treaty-based international law is as morally effective as is the domestic law by which these individuals are governed" (69). Treaty-based international law, though, is morally effective "only if decent individuals would have entered it themselves" (69). As a result, for such law to be morally effective, it must promote the security and protect the rights of the citizens on whose behalf the law is signed. With this framework in place, Benbaji and Statman apply it to the morality and law of war.

The UN Charter constitutes the ad bellum agreement among states (the logic of which also applies to some stateless nations, Benbaji and Statman argue). According to Benbaji and Statman, the agreement bars the parties from waging some wars that would be precontractually permissible, like preventive or subsistence wars, or wars of humanitarian intervention. At the same time, though, the ad bellum agreement permits states to wage some wars that would be pre-contractually forbidden, like defensive wars aiming at the protection of territorial boundaries which themselves have no just historical basis. It is in the interest of states to waive their right to use force in resolving disputes, even if on rare occasions the use of such force would be morally justified. Benbaji and Statman put the point eloquently: "the peace that the Charter aims to maintain is just a peace, not necessarily a just peace" (4).

Turning to jus in bello, Benbaji and Statman argue that the contractarian logic grounds the basic principles of the LOAC: non-combatant immunity, the moral equality of combatants (MEC), and the permission to inflict collateral harm on civilian and civilian infrastructure. Because the MEC has been unceasingly criticized over the past fifteen years, they are particularly concerned with arguing that the contractarian framework they've developed vindicates the MEC.

They argue that decent and self-interested states have every reason to prefer an arrangement in which combatants are permitted to target one another. Their argument for this view is familiar: the alternative, which requires soldiers to ensure that their war is just, would diminish the ability of states both to deter enemies from aggressing and to protect their rights in the event of such aggression. States, therefore, grant one another the legal right to maintain obedient armies, whose soldiers are responsible only for their own conduct in war rather than the war itself. Since such a contract is morally effective, the legal equality of combatants yields the moral equality of combatants.

Similar reasoning grounds the principle of non-combatant immunity. Such a principle, Benbaji and Statman ague, is difficult to justify precontractually since those non-combatants who contribute substantially to an unjust war seem morally liable to be attacked. But to reduce the carnage of war, states agree to a blanket prohibition against targeting enemy civilians. This prohibition does not prohibit collaterally killing enemy civilians, since such a prohibition would be pragmatically impossible to uphold, thereby threatening the war agreement in toto. These agreements are morally effective since a) they are fair in that there is no reason to think antecedently that it will discriminate against any party, b) they are mutually beneficial in that they result in a Pareto-superior state of affairs relative to the non-contractual alternative, and c) they are agreed upon by states whose citizens authorize them to contract on their behalf. Consequently, Benbaji and Statman conclude that the prohibitions and permission in question are not merely legal but moral as well.

Theorists have been reluctant to adopt a contractarian framework for the ethics of war in part because it seems to presume that the agreement is voided if one party violates it. This has unpalatable consequences insofar as it suggests, for example, that if one party targets POWs or civilians, then the other party is permitted to do so as well (if doing so is sufficiently effective in promoting a just cause). But Benbaji and Statman argue that such a violation does not void the war agreement. Instead, "the normative implications of breaching the war contract are themselves part of the contract." They argue that the war agreement includes contingencies that delineate permissible responses to violations by conferring remedial rights upon the violated party. Such remedial rights effectively weaken the in bello constraints on war by permitting retaliation but within highly circumscribed conditions. This deters violations of the contract to the benefit of all parties involved. In cases where the violation is egregious and widespread, as in cases where a party resorts to weapons of mass destruction, the war agreement permits the violated party to respond in kind. Again, these agreements yield concomitant moral prohibitions and permissions, in accordance with the contractualist framework Benbaji and Statman developed.

From summary of the book, I turn to criticism.

On the contractarian framework Benbaji and Statman develop, citizens vest in their state the authority to waive their rights on their behalf. Citizens do so by accepting the laws of their state, which means adhering to those rules and regarding them as normatively binding. Where these rules are fair and mutually beneficial, accepting them is morally effective. Indeed, on their view "by merely belonging to a society and participating in the social practices within it, individuals vindicate the presumption that they freely accept the mutually beneficial and fair social rules that underlie these practices" (47). In this way, citizens authorize their state to vicariously waive their right not to be collaterally killed in war.

The problem with this view, though, is that Hart's concept of acceptance is too weak a hook upon which to hang the kind of authorization necessary to vicariously waive rights as fundamental as the right to life. This is because Hart's concept of acceptance is supposed to ground what counts as a social rule -- including social rules that are not morally effective. On this view, social rules include the rules of etiquette, grammar, customs, and -- of particular interest to legal theorists -- the rules of recognition which determine what creates, modifies, and nullifies law in a society with a legal system. For Hart, a social rule requires not only a convergence in behavior, but also an internal attitude of acceptance toward the rule, in virtue of which we come to see the rule as normative. This normative attitude confers legitimacy on the social rule in question. But Hart is quite clear that this legitimacy is not necessarily moral legitimacy:

But the dichotomy of 'law based merely on power' and 'law which is accepted as morally binding' is not exhaustive. Not only may vast numbers be coerced by laws which they do not regard as morally binding, but it is not even true that those who do accept the system voluntarily, must conceive of themselves as morally bound to do so, though the system will be most stable when they do so. In fact, their allegiance to the system may be based on many different considerations: calculations of long-term self-interest; disinterested interest in others; an unreflecting inherited or traditional attitude; or the mere wish to do as others do.[1]

For Hart, we might accept a rule out of self-interest, because we feel coerced, or out of deference to tradition. Crucially, though "These attitudes may coexist with a more or less vivid realization that the rules are morally objectionable" (194). Indeed, Benbaji and Statman explicitly admit that acceptance does not entail endorsement: the citizens of a country "freely accept" a legal system, they say, simply "by virtue of having a standing disposition to follow it qua members of the society to which they belong" (49). And later: "social rules may be mutually beneficial and fair, and thereby morally effective, even if they have no legitimate authority" (190).

Consider, then the citizens of an authoritarian regime, such as China. The vast majority of them presumably accept -- in the Hartian sense -- the social rules in virtue of which Xi Jinping counts as their President. He thus counts as China's President even though he is unelected and even if the majority of those who accept him as their President refrain from endorsing him as such. They might accept the rules in virtue of which he counts as President while simultaneously denying that those rules are morally effective. Suppose, then, that China's leader signs an international treaty on behalf of the Chinese people, that waives some of their most fundamental precontractual rights, including their rights to life in certain cases, in exchange for contractually recognized rights. On what grounds can we say that the Chinese people have thereby waived their right, given that accepting their President as such does not entail endorsing him as such? Benbaji and Statman might respond in two ways, both of which I think are inadequate.

First, though Benbaji and Statman ostensibly adopt Hart's notion of acceptance, they seem to morally load it in way that Hart specifically denies. In particular, they say that a system of social rules "is accepted freely by those who subject themselves to it if and only if it is sufficiently good" and that "a system of legal rules is sufficiently good only if it is fair; namely, it neither creates nor solidifies unfair or disrespectful social relationships" (69-70). If this is required for acceptance, then acceptance might be morally effective in the way that Benbaji and Statman want.

The problem, though, is that authoritarian regimes include unfair or disrespectful social relationships between those with political power and those without such power. Arguably, they do so by definition. The politically underprivileged class is permanently denied basic rights, including the right of political representation. Surely this is an unfair and disrespectful social relationship. If this precludes acceptance, then China's political leadership does not have the legitimacy to contract on behalf of its people after all. The result is that the war agreement would apply only to a handful of states, whereas Benbaji and Statman argue that it applies to all those in the UN, and still others besides. We cannot, then, 'morally load' acceptance in an attempt to explain how the decisions authoritarian leaders make are morally effective.

But what if, instead, we morally load the decisions that the authoritarian leaders themselves make? This is the second strategy Benbaji and Statman seem to adopt. They suggest that where an unendorsed but accepted political leader makes a fiduciary decision pertaining to the citizen's precontractual rights, that decision is morally effective if that decision is a relevantly good one, in that it would make sense for the people to make that decision themselves. Thus, regarding the war agreement specifically, Benbaji and Statman say: "It is morally effective only if, in signing it, states acted on the behalf of their (self-interested and yet decent) citizens, such that under this war agreement, these citizens enjoy better security, and their rights are better protected" (69). The agreement, they say, "is morally effective only if decent individuals would have entered it themselves" (69). Maybe, then, an unendorsed but accepted authoritarian leader can indeed make decisions that vicariously waive the fundamental rights of his citizens, if the decisions are morally good enough.

This view has bizarre implications, though. Suppose the authoritarian leader of a country chooses not to be part of the war agreement. Given that such a decision is morally effective only if decent individuals would have entered it themselves, the leader's decision is morally ineffective. This decision is ineffective because, by hypothesis, decent individuals would have chosen differently. Alternatively, suppose the leader does indeed choose to be part of the war agreement. But it is not because of this decision that the country subsequently enters the war agreement; after all, the alternative decision would have been ineffective. Therefore, no matter what decision the leader ostensibly makes, the country ends up part of the war agreement. It is, then, conceptually impossible for the authoritarian leader to affect whether his state is part of the war agreement. If the leader's decisions are morally irrelevant in this way, then it is unclear in what sense the account of war remains contractualist, at least as far as unendorsed authoritarian regimes are concerned. Benbaji and Statman do not adequately address how authoritarian regimes contract on behalf of their people; this shortcoming threatens their contractarian project as whole.

Benbaji and Statman's book will be -- and deserves to be -- the definitive account of a contractarian theory of war, for years to come. But as I noted, the book has shortcomings. I focused on one: the book does not adequately explain how citizens of authoritarian regimes, via their government, authorize the war agreement, given that doing so requires waiving pre-contractually fundamental rights. Regardless, this book will and should serve as the definitive alternative to revisionist war ethics.

[1] HLA Hart, Concept of Law, 3rd Ed., Oxford University Press, 2012, 203.