War Crimes and Just War

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Larry May, War Crimes and Just War, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 360pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521691536.

Reviewed by Peter Tramel, USMA, West Point


In a famous case, a soldier, A, has an enemy soldier, B, in his sights.  B is naked, taking a bath hundreds of yards behind his lines; he is unarmed and obviously has no idea that he is vulnerable.  Nevertheless, A could hit him from here.  Would A be wrong to take the shot?  Not according to many just war theorists, and not according to current international law.  But Larry May thinks so.

War crimes are not, or are not merely, violations of justice, according to May.  They are violations of humaneness.  On this basis he argues for a new understanding of both just war theory and international war crimes law.  Compared with most traditional just war theory and current international law, his new understanding is both less permissive and more forgiving: it conceives more warlike activities as criminal, but it calls for kinder treatment of accused and convicted war criminals -- even terrorists.

This is the second of a planned three-volume series on "the moral foundations of international criminal law".  The first volume was Crimes Against Humanity: A Normative Account (Cambridge, 2005).  May tentatively calls the third, still in progress: Aggression and Crimes Against Peace.

The borders between moral philosophy and international law are "porous", May claims.  Moral argument directly affects the construction and practice of international law.  So an investigation into the normative grounds of international war crimes law could significantly advance both moral and legal understanding.  May searches for these normative grounds in early 17th century just war theory, especially the work of Hugo Grotius.  He likes Grotius's emphases on collective responsibility, honor, and mercy, or, more generally, a duty to be humane, conceived as a natural law or, at least, part of a "law of peoples" (Jus Gentium).  In this duty he finds the normative ground of the part of just war theory that considers the permissibility of conduct in war (Jus in Bello) and international war crimes law.

The relevant conception of "normative grounds" is a legal theorist's, not a moral theorist's.  For instance he does not seem to mean that his normative ground cannot be reduced to more fundamental moral principles -- such as principles of justice (broadly conceived) or principles of utility.  In his legal sense a principle is normative if it is not merely a matter of convention, explicit agreement, or positive law; it is a ground if it is or ought to be a basis of (legal) law.

The book has four parts: A - D.  In Part A, "Philosophical Groundings", May attempts to articulate and directly argue for his principle of humaneness.  He finds the roots and content of this principle in three main ideas.  First, the citizens of states at war are collectively responsible for how they train and regulate those who represent them in war, i.e., their soldiers.  Second, since war threatens in so many ways to reduce their soldiers to mere thugs and murderers, those who send them to war must instill in them a greater than ordinary sense of honor -- one that can resist these moral threats so that soldiers can represent their states as they should.  Third, essential to this sense of honor is a strong inclination towards mercy, or compassion.  While May never tries to precisely state his principle of humaneness, this tripartite view of its grounds informs his application of it in the next three sections to hard problems of just war theory and international law.

On its own, Part A is more interesting than helpful.  For instance, May makes much of the opposition between his view and views grounded in considerations of justice or utility.  However, the difference between his view and ones grounded in justice turns out to depend on conceiving justice in only very narrow, retributivist terms -- terms that conceive retributive justice in a vacuum, as if it could be conceived without implications concerning broader justice -- or in simple legal terms.  He makes no attempt to distinguish his view from more interesting attempts to conceive morality or political duty in terms of justice, such as Kant's, Rawls's, or Scanlon's.  (None of these figures even rates a mention.)  This omission may be important: some of his primary opponents from the just war theory tradition ground their views in Kantian or neo-Kantian ideas.  As regards utility, at one point he calls the Geneva Conventions "anti-utilitarian" because they prohibit some activities, such as torture, without exception, as if utilitarians could not endorse legal prohibitions without exceptions.

Whether, from the standpoint of moral theory, his idea is as distinctive as advertised, his understanding of it leads to a new conception of just war theory and the grounds of international law.  Although his principle of humaneness seems hopelessly vague on its own -- prescribing nothing much clearer than "act humanely" -- his tripartite conception of its sources, in terms of collective responsibility, honor, and mercy, has chops.  These first become apparent as he applies his principle to the controversial "doctrine of the moral equality of soldiers", according to which soldiers are not responsible for the justice of their causes.  Proponents of the doctrine, for instance Michael Walzer, usually defend it by appeal to the coercion and ignorance involved in being a soldier.  But are such defenses adequate?  Some soldiers volunteer, and in some cases it seems like soldiers ought to know that their causes are unjust.  May argues that even if we cannot always defend the doctrine by appeal to considerations of justice, the principle of humanity gives us a reason to behave as if the doctrine is true.

In Part B, "Problems in Identifying War Crimes", he develops his principle by applying it to various kinds of cases.  He criticizes traditional Jus in Bello conceptions of distinction, necessity, and proportionality.  For instance, he argues that traditional ways of distinguishing combatants from noncombatants, such as in terms of status as soldiers or civilians, fail to depend on a morally relevant difference, while others, such as in terms of innocence or guilt, fail to provide rules we can use.  He argues in favor of understanding the distinction in terms of the vulnerability of people, which he understands in terms of their ability (even if asymmetrical) to defend themselves.  Since the naked soldier in my opening example is unarmed, he is relevantly vulnerable and thus not a combatant, at least not so long as he remains undressed and unarmed.  That he will likely become a combatant again very soon is not a good enough reason to shoot him, now.

He also argues that one may usually not use weapons against which enemies have no defense (such as poisons or chemicals), and that one may almost never torture prisoners, not even in ticking bomb cases.  His conclusions lead him in the direction of a contingent pacifism, according to which fighting wars is never permissible because it never happens that we can both fight them according to the right rules and fight them so as to win.  However, he only endorses moving in a contingent pacifist direction, not arriving there.

The predominant theme in his relevant intuitions, and thus the development of his principle of humanity through these applications, is that duties of humaneness arise as appropriate responses to awareness of vulnerability.  For instance, he thinks that the kind of vulnerability involved in being a prisoner creates strong fiduciary, or at least stewardship, obligations on the part of those who hold prisoners.

In Part C, "Normative Principles", May reformulates just war theory principles of discrimination, necessity, and proportionality, in light of his Part B criticisms of traditional formulations.  His reformulations are "fine-grained", which in his parlance means that they are not really formulations but, rather, hierarchies of "rules of thumb" developed through consideration of cases and arguments.  In each case the idea is to provide some initial test, but then require refinement as time for thought allows.  For instance, in an emergency, when there is no time to consider, one should distinguish between combatants and noncombatants according to whether people are soldiers or not.  But given more information, and time to consider, it may well be that one ought to decide, based on considerations of vulnerability, that a certain soldier is not a combatant, or that a certain civilian is a combatant.  Judging whether and to what extent one is in an emergency are also matters for hierarchies of rules and refinements in necessity and proportionality judgments.

In Part D, "Prosecuting War Crimes", May applies his principle to cases in international law.  He argues that the international community is sometimes justified in punishing soldiers for war crimes, but in these case defenses of duress or superior orders ought to carry more exculpatory, or at least mitigating, weight than they have in recent war crimes trials, such as in the 1998 trial of Drazen Erdemovic.  He argues that, typically, commanders deserve more blame for war crimes than ordinary soldiers.  Nevertheless, commanders ought to be able to give necessity defenses in some cases, and in practice mens rea is often particularly difficult to establish in the case of commanders.  May concludes with a consideration of terrorists.  He thinks that the international community should punish terrorism, but he argues that terrorists deserve decent treatment, clear legal status, and trials.  As he puts it "there is no category of people who 'fall through the cracks' and to whom we should not act with honor".

Readers with philosophical or legal interest in these issues will not want to miss May's book, in which he offers much that is novel and more that is insightful.