War Crimes: Causes, Excuses, and Blame

War Crimes

Matthew Talbert and Jessica Wolfendale, War Crimes: Causes, Excuses, and Blame, Oxford University Press, 2019, 168pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190675875.

Reviewed by Stephen N. Woodside, United States Military Academy at West Point


The views expressed in this review are those of the author and do not reflect the official policy or position of the United States Military Academy, the US Army, or the Department of Defense.

Matthew Talbert and Jessica Wolfendale's book is timely, carefully argued, and a nice example of how proper moral philosophy might inform political and legal debates regarding serious criminal conduct in war. Thus, it is important reading for moral and legal philosophers, military policy makers, and military leaders. The central question of the book is this: "Are military personnel who commit war crimes culpable for their actions… [o]r should they be excused because of situational pressures under which they act" (1)? More precisely, Talbert and Wolfendale are focused on those cases, which they argue are the most pervasive, where situational pressures (for example, military culture and ideology) lead a perpetrator to mistakenly, yet non-culpably, believe that her actions are morally permissible. The authors' view is that perpetrators in these cases, even though they act from non-culpable moral ignorance, are morally culpable for their war crimes (absent any other typically excusing conditions, such as coercion or duress). Their thesis rests on the more general moral principle that moral ignorance does not exculpate.[1] There is already extensive literature on this more general principle, including publications by Talbert himself, and the authors nicely engage with some of the most influential pieces in this area throughout their book. Their book, then, is also important reading for legal and moral philosophers interested in questions of ignorance and responsibility outside of war.

While the authors' main view is quite plausible, I found some of their arguments in support of it to be puzzling and, at times, circular. Some of this stemmed from inconsistent terminology, unclear distinctions, and some questionable responses to compelling objections. In what follows, I will present and explain these arguments, while offering my criticism of them. I will then offer some brief comments on their remarks on certain issues, such as punishing and preventing war crimes, that are beyond their main concerns.

The first three chapters of the book are devoted to a discussion of the causes of war crimes, or at least a significant number of them. Talbert and Wolfendale acknowledge that some war crimes are caused by the "heat of battle." These are war crimes committed by soldiers who likely know that what they are doing is wrong, but lack the self-control to refrain from committing them, either because of, say, a mental breakdown or an insatiable desire for revenge.[2] And while the perpetrators of these heat-of-battle crimes might not be fully blameworthy on their view, Talbert and Wolfendale make the following important point:

such "heat of battle" war crimes are few and far between compared to the most egregious war crimes, such as systematic torture, systematic rape, the deliberate targeting of civilians, and genocide. Institutionalized and large-scale war crimes of this kind are different from heat of battle crimes not just in the numbers of victims and perpetrators involved, but in virtue of the fact that such war crimes typically are not viewed as crimes at all by those who devise and implement them. Instead, these crimes are justified and rationalized by reference to moral principles and moral virtues, to such an extent that those involved may sincerely believe that their actions are required by moral duty. (54)

While their claim that heat-of-battle crimes are "few and far between" might be an overstatement, their point about the latter kind is plausible and terribly important. It does seem that too often war crimes perpetrators are portrayed as rogue actors who lack the mental or moral fortitude to persevere through the stressors of battle to do what is right. This view might serve to provide some comfort for policy makers and military leaders seeking to distance themselves from moral responsibility for these crimes, but perhaps even more problematic is that it makes the prevention of war crimes deceptively simple -- more focus and training on military virtues like loyalty and duty. However, if the authors' view is correct, this will do little, if anything, to prevent a significant number of war crimes. Indeed, on their view, the institutionalized and large-scale war crimes they are examining are often committed by perpetrators who act with a sense of loyalty and duty, and who sincerely (yet falsely) believe that what they are doing is morally right, and perhaps even obligatory. This leads to some of their proposals on the prevention of war crimes, on which I will comment later.

To begin their support for their main thesis that moral ignorance does not excuse war crimes perpetrators, Talbert and Wolfendale argue against the view that these war crimes are caused primarily by external situational pressures such as military culture and ideology. On their view, while these external ideological frameworks do play a causal role in the perpetration of war crimes, it is the perpetrator's interpretation of these frameworks that ultimately motivates her to act, where this interpretation is partly a function of her "preexisting beliefs, goals, self-conception, and values" (61). In arguing for this, Talbert and Wolfendale believe they have established a foothold for sufficient moral agency, even in the presence of strong situational pressures. But as the authors anticipate, their situationist opponents might object that a perpetrator's beliefs, goals, etc., could themselves be a result of the external situational pressures such as military culture and ideology. Admittedly, this is a difficult proposition to rule out, but it seems to me that the authors' reply begs the question. They write, "But this perspective ignores the agency of military personnel and downplays the active role that they play in ascribing personal meaning and significance to their actions" (67-68). But, of course, whether these agents have sufficient moral agency to make them culpable for their crimes is the question at hand.

Talbert and Wolfendale do concede that it might not be reasonable to expect soldiers to recognize the moral impermissibility of their actions due to situational pressures, but they argue that it is nevertheless reasonable to blame them for their war crimes:

what matters for moral blame are the judgments and attitudes that are actually expressed through agents' behavior and not whether these agents had control over the formation of those judgments and attitudes. On our view, it does not matter how an agent acquired the judgments or beliefs that led him to commit blameworthy acts -- what matters is what those judgments reveal about how he assesses and responds to the interests and needs of other people. (87-88)

At this point, it is important to distinguish between two related but separate views, which the authors are not always careful to make clear. One view, the stronger one, is that moral ignorance, even if non-culpable, does not exculpate at all. This seems to be the authors' view, as suggested above. On their view, or so it seems, that a war crime was perpetrated out of non-culpable moral ignorance is morally irrelevant regarding assessments of blameworthiness. Another view, the weaker one, is that while non-culpable moral ignorance can excuse a war crimes perpetrator to some degree for her actions, it cannot fully exculpate. This is an important distinction, which the authors seem to blur on occasions like the following: "We conclude, then, that perpetrators who believe -- and even reasonably believe -- that they behave permissibly may still be blameworthy" (102). This could be read as an endorsement of the weaker view stated above, which is consistent with the claim that moral ignorance can exculpate to some degree.

Despite their lack of clarity at times, it seems fair to interpret Talbert and Wolfendale as arguing for the stronger claim that moral ignorance does not exculpate to any extent. While this stronger view is more controversial than the weaker one, the authors draw some plausible support from a similar rationale offered by philosophers such as Nomy Arpaly. According to these philosophers, what matters for questions of blameworthiness are the attitudes and beliefs of the perpetrators towards their victims, which are expressed through their actions. If these attitudes and beliefs are morally objectionable in the sense that they lack "appropriate moral concern" for the victim, the perpetrator is culpable (93). And the fact that a perpetrator was non-culpable in believing that his behavior towards his victim was permissible does not rule out his having a morally objectionable attitude toward his victim. This is why, on their view, "circumstantial" ignorance can exculpate, while moral ignorance cannot. When one harms a victim from circumstantial ignorance (for example, harming one's friend by unknowingly serving him poisonous food), one's actions typically express no objectionable attitude towards their victim. This is not the case with moral ignorance. In their words:

circumstantial ignorance blocks the inference, which would otherwise be natural, from the fact that she harmed you to the conclusion that she has an inappropriate level of concern for your welfare . . . her harming you is not evidence of ill will. By contrast, while the soldier may suffer from a form of ignorance, he is not ignorant of the circumstances in which he acts or the consequences of his behavior. A torturer who thinks that he behaves permissibly is aware that he harms his victims . . . ; he is only unaware that it is wrong to harm them. This moral ignorance . . . is fully compatible with the torturer having ill will, or at least a lack of appropriate regard for his victims. (92-93)

This view, also endorsed by Arpaly and others, is often referred to as a "quality-of-will" account of moral responsibility and blameworthiness, and it is worth taking seriously.

However, one potential problem with their view, which the authors attempt to address, concerns the interpretation of "appropriate moral concern." Talbert and Wolfendale rightly acknowledge that "having as much regard for another person as one ought to have is compatible, in some cases, with killing that person (otherwise, all instances of killing in self-defense [would be blameworthy])" (127). The point, as I understand it, is not that permissible self-defense is typically not blameworthy simply because it is permissible. Rather, it is because it typically does not express inappropriate moral concern for the victim. So sometimes intentionally killing or harming a person does express appropriate moral concern for the victim, such that these perpetrators would not be blameworthy. And this could be true in cases of both permissible and impermissible harming.

So far so good, but turning to more relevant cases, the authors concede that some war crimes perpetrators could, in principle at least, be excused based on their appropriate moral concern for their victims. For example, if a soldier is non-culpable in believing that torture in his case is permissible based on his non-culpable belief that there is a national security threat and that this threat can only be eliminated by torturing his victim, then he has what the authors call a "justification-based excuse," even if what he does is, in fact, impermissible (94-96).[3] And this is because, presumably, the above beliefs and attitudes on which he acts do not express inappropriate moral concern. On the other hand, a soldier who tortures his victim from the belief, even if non-culpable, that she deserves this treatment is culpable. On the authors' view, the latter expresses inappropriate moral concern for his victim in that he acts from a false belief regarding her moral standing, which makes it objectionable, even if non-culpable. The authors suggest that a justification-based excuse is available only to those who are non-culpably ignorant of "morally neutral facts." This appears to be another way of framing the claim that while circumstantial ignorance can exculpate, moral ignorance cannot. My worry is that the same could be said for the torturer who they accept as excused. Is he not acting from a belief that his victim's moral status is not as weighty as the threat to national security? I am skeptical that there is a morally relevant distinction between the two cases, or at least in the way they describe it.

Talbert and Wolfendale then go on to discuss perhaps more likely cases where perpetrators act out of "motivated irrationality" (98). For example, they discuss the possibility that some Nazis believed that exterminating the Jews was permissible based on their belief that they were a national threat to Germany, where this latter belief was likely motivated by underlying contempt for them. But this is hardly a counterexample to the claim that non-culpable moral ignorance can exculpate. Assuming there were such Nazis, their belief that the genocide was permissible was grounded in their culpable belief that Jews were a threat to Germany (culpable because it was motivated by their contempt for them). This suggests that they acted out of culpable ignorance. Thus, we can agree with Talbert and Wolfendale that these Nazis were culpable for their crimes, while maintaining that non-culpable moral ignorance can exculpate. That excuse simply was not available to them.

My final worry concerns what I take to be a separate argument for Talbert and Wolfendale's view. To set up their argument, the authors cite the Bosnian Genocide wherein some Serbian soldiers were reported to have systematically raped Bosnian women to promote ethnic cleansing. For the sake of argument, Talbert and Wolfendale assume that these soldiers were non-culpable in believing that their rapes were permissible and that they acted on the basis of this ignorance. But if non-culpable moral ignorance exculpates, the soldiers would not be blameworthy for their actions, which would mean that it would be inappropriate for their victims to blame them. And admittedly, that seems implausible. They write:

this response asks the victims to accept a false moral perspective, which may also be the moral perspective of their rapists. Thus, to take moral blame off the table here fails to adequately account for the wrongs done to the victims: it invites them to misdiagnose the moral quality and interpersonal significance of the treatment to which they were subjected. (108)

The authors nicely anticipate the cogent objection that although it would be understandable for the women to blame their rapists given the violent nature of the crime, this does not entail that the rapists were, in fact, blameworthy. In other words, we would not blame the victims for blaming their rapists, even if the latter were not actually blameworthy. However, Talbert and Wolfendale's reply is puzzling:

This [objection] also seems to us to fail to do justice to the victims. Our view is that the victims would make no mistake at all in blaming since the treatment they received warrants blame as much as any treatment can. (108)

Their last claim seems like more question-begging, but more importantly, I worry that their point regarding justice for the victims is misplaced. It might be that the authors are conflating matters of compensatory justice with those of blameworthiness. Supposing that the rapists were not blameworthy, it still seems plausible (and consistent) to suggest that they owed their victims compensation for wronging them. Indeed, we can reach the same conclusion in all-things-considered permissible actions that wrong others. If we are threshold deontologists, as I believe the authors are, it could be permissible to harm another to prevent extraordinarily bad consequences even when the victim maintains her right not to be harmed. In a case like this, we can say that it is permissible to infringe the right of the victim, even though this still wrongs her. And it might be that the wronging makes the perpetrator morally liable to pay compensation to the victim even though he is not blameworthy for his action. (Alternatively, it might be the beneficiaries of the perpetrator's action who owe compensation to the victim.) To be clear, I am not suggesting that the Serbian rapes were permissible or that the soldiers were not blameworthy for their crimes. My point is simply that, supposing the soldiers were non-culpable in believing that their crimes were permissible, the authors have failed to establish that they were nevertheless blameworthy, at least with this last line of argument.

In the final chapter, Talbert and Wolfendale turn to some thoughts on the punishment and prevention of war crimes. One of their main claims regarding punishment is that a "superior orders defense" in itself (that is, absent coercion, duress, etc.) provides no good reason to mitigate punishment for war crimes perpetrators, as it does not make them any less blameworthy. In discussing one possible rationale, "the motive argument," for the opposing view, the authors do concede that on their view "Motive can make a difference to an agent's blameworthiness" depending on how more or less morally objectionable it is (147). However, according to the authors, acting from a motive of duty is no less objectionable than acting from, say, pure malice. This seems hard to believe. Again, it is one thing to say that a motive of duty could fully exculpate, which I doubt, but there seems to be a morally relevant difference between this motive and one based on pure malice.

Lastly, in their remarks on the prevention of war crimes, Talbert and Wolfendale make the important point that, to prevent war crimes, we must first properly understand their causes. Although this might be somewhat obvious, it is worth emphasizing given the fact that war crimes are too often attributed to an individual lack of resilience in the heat of battle. And as noted earlier, this perception runs the risk of producing misguided military training aimed at preventing war crimes:

The belief that war crimes at least partly result from individual failures of virtue, character, or moral judgment is a common one. However, one of the key insights of the account of war crimes we have developed in this book is that war crimes perpetrators often believe themselves to be acting in accordance with moral virtue, duty, and practical wisdom. Those involved in devising and implementing institutionalized or large-scale war crimes are typically operating within a moral framework in which these acts are viewed as not just compatible with military virtues such as duty and honor, but as morally required by such virtues. To interpret such crimes as resulting largely from individual failures of character . . . is therefore to miss this crucial fact about the moral psychology of these kinds of war crimes. (150-151)

In my view, this is Talbert and Wolfendale's most important insight, and not just for academics. Military leaders and educators should take note and recognize that otherwise good military virtues like loyalty, duty, and honor can be dubiously interpreted to promote and justify the commission of war crimes, as can various moral theories and principles. Thus, as the authors suggest, it is not enough to teach these virtues and moral principles in educating soldiers; we must also demonstrate the ways in which they can (and are) used to justify criminal behavior like torture and terrorism.


[1] Moral ignorance is to be distinguished from what the authors call "circumstantial" ignorance, which, on their view, can exculpate. Others, such as Nomy Arpaly, refer to the latter as "factual" ignorance (for example, ignorance that what one takes to be sugar is, in fact, poison). More on this later.

[2] "The killing of 16 Afghanis in March 2012 by Staff Sergeant Robert Bale is an example of this kind of war crime. Similarly, the Haditha massacre has been explained as resulting partly from the Marines' desire to avenge the killing of one of their comrades" (54).

[3] I found the authors' discussion of justification-based excuses rather convoluted and inconsistent, so I am not entirely confident that my interpretation is accurate. Nevertheless, I have attempted to apply the most charitable interpretation.