Was Jesus God?

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Richard Swinburne, Was Jesus God?, Oxford University Press, 2008, 175pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199203116.

Reviewed by Phillip Wiebe, Trinity Western University


This book articulates a coherent vision of Christian faith using its tradition, scriptures, creeds, and the views of prominent early theologians. The first half addresses the existence and nature of God, including grounds for considering God to be triune and disposed to co-suffer with humanity. The second half explores the theological significance of the life of Jesus. Swinburne is doing theology here, which can be brought out by reflecting on the remarkable dogma of the Virgin Birth. A historian would ask for the sources on the life of Jesus, and finding some fifty to sixty, would order them chronologically, undertake a comparative analysis, assess them in relation to other historical sources, etc. Upon discovering that this birth is mentioned in very few documents, and knowing that virgin human births (especially of males) are biologically improbable, the historian would conclude that this part of the life of Jesus taught in the Church is a fable. However, a theologian would consult the tradition, texts, and creeds on the matter, and finding that these show some consistency, would advance a Virgin Birth. A critic of Christian faith would wonder why we would do theology when we can do history. Swinburne accepts the fabulous nature of the OT books of Daniel and Jonah, but, unlike many modern exegetes, refuses to regard the Virgin Birth and Resurrection as fables. Swinburne's book is written from within the Church, and attempts to show that if God exists and has the attributes that tradition has given to him, especially the love that marks a triune nature, God will act in history much as tradition has taught. The book will appeal to those who trust the tradition, and possibly to some for whom the Holy Scriptures are the hinge upon which Christian claims depend. Whether Swinburne could convince those who find themselves unable to trust either the tradition or the bible is unclear.

Swinburne advances a series of claims that precede uniquely Christian revelation: that the existence of God has some probability from features in the universe, such as orderliness or religious experience (pp. 15-16); that a modest probability can be assigned to the claim that God is a person who is rational, free, eternal, omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good, a source of moral obligation (11), and necessarily existent; that the claim that just one being is God is simpler than possible competitors, and so has plausibility on that score; and that God has probably created humans with freedom, whose purpose is found in following God's will and commands (20-21). Swinburne describes this cluster of claims as "bare theism," which is prior evidence for Christian theism (23) and gives it some prior probability. The evidence about Jesus and the Church he founded form the posterior evidence for specifically Christian theism (23). Swinburne's clear distinction between these two kinds of theism is welcome.

There is a difficulty for Swinburne's claim that the existence of God is probable, or more probable than not, or more probable with an ordered universe than without, etc. because he uses the logical interpretation of probability. Philosophers identify six interpretations of probability statements. These include (a) the equiprobable case interpretation, known from games of chance, (b) the relative frequency interpretation, known from statistics, (c) the subjective interpretation, known from common subjective estimates (some of which are irrational), (d) the personal interpretation, which imposes rationality upon the subjective interpretation, e.g., by demanding that subjective values satisfy the probability calculus, (e) the propensity interpretation, which attempts to assess varied causal factors in a physical situation, and (f) the logical interpretation (the one Swinburne uses), which attempts to weigh the evidence for some hypothesis. Rudolf Carnap investigated the logical interpretation at considerable length and held that the probability value P(X,Y) reflects the relative amount of content in the two statements X and Y. As a consequence, Carnap deems the logical probability of universal statements on limited evidence to have a value at or near zero. Since a universal statement such as Newton's gravitational law has unlimited import, a finite statement of evidence, say, observations about pendulums, does not count appreciably. The difficulty arises for Swinburne in assessing the probability of God's existence (E) on some feature in human experience or in the universe, such as the presence of order (O). Swinburne holds that P(E,O) is greater than P(E) by itself. But since the description of God includes infinite properties, finite evidence is negligible in comparison, thereby yielding uncertainty about whether P(E,O) is greater than P(E).

Since the logical interpretation conforms to the probability calculus, Swinburne uses theorems from it to help him estimate problematic values. This calculus is a formal conceptual structure that sets general constraints on probability statements, and shows, for example, that the absolute probability of X or not-X is 1, but it does not generally allow particular probability values to be calculated. If we assume that no probability values in denominators are zero, we can prove that P(E,O) > P(E) is equivalent to P(O,G) > P(O, ~G). The last of these values, P(O, ~G), involves an estimate that order is found, given that it is not the case that God exists. According to conventional logic, the denial of an existential claim ('God exists') is equivalent to a universal statement (~(∃x)Fx ↔(x)~Fx), which in this case amounts to considering the probability that order is found given everything that is not God. Since we know a limited amount, the list of things that are not God could include transcendent beings with an infinite number of finite powers, or with a finite number of infinite powers, or with a finite number of finite (but remarkable) powers, thus possibly making P(O,G) close to P(O, ~G). Swinburne does not explain how his interpretation of probability statements can get around this problem. Swinburne's discussion of the nature of God and the events that flow from God's existence sometimes gives me the impression that he is inadvertently using the propensity interpretation of probability, since the events said to flow from God are ones he is deemed by theists to have the propensity to produce. The propensity interpretation does not conform to the probability calculus, so the equivalence I have just used cannot be advanced, and the indirect calculation of vital probability values would not be available.

Swinburne argues that God must be a trinity because love requires an object, and is perfected when the two find a third whom they both love, and who loves them in return. This argument strikes me as a reflection of a prior commitment to Trinitarian views, but my thinking this might only reflect my former difficulties with the Trinity. Swinburne maintains that God's love obligated him to share our suffering (40), which required becoming human (41f), atoning for our wrongdoing (53f), teaching us how to live morally (62f), and establishing a Church in which his revelatory acts could be correctly interpreted (75f). He further argues that the probability is considerable that God would send a special person to earth (84), who turns out to have been Jesus. Swinburne mentions some competing views found in the Christian Church -- Eastern and Western, Catholic and Protestant -- around various doctrinal matters, including the Incarnation, and in delineating views that would be maximally acceptable in Christendom he helpfully contributes to reconciliatory discussions between divided segments of the Church.

Swinburne addresses the Resurrection of Jesus at some length, presenting it as the "signature of God" upon his life, his message, his death, and the events that followed in the Church. Swinburne considers the prior probability that a prophet (like Jesus) would emerge at some time in Hebrew history, then die and be resurrected, so significant that the evidence deriving from the biblical witnesses to the Resurrection need not be particularly impressive to make this event highly probable (chap. 8, esp. p. 126f). This position is counterintuitive. If I understand Swinburne correctly, he would have us think that a disciple such as Simon Peter, a Sanhedrin member such as Gamaliel, or a woman in the company that attended Jesus and his disciples, all familiar with what Hebrew faith had taught to that point, had such strong evidence for the claim that some prophet would appear, be killed and then be resurrected, that the events associated with the Resurrection itself hardly increased the probability from what it already was. When Jesus began his public ministry, therefore, and exhibited the characteristics of a prophet, his Resurrection should have come as no surprise. This is not what we see in the NT narratives, however: the disciples appear to have been surprised by the Resurrection; the women who went to the sepulcher where the body of Jesus lay went there in order to anoint it with spices, not to look for a resurrected prophet; and when Peter spoke to a crowd in Jerusalem about the death of Jesus he said that they had acted in ignorance (Acts 3:17), implying that their religious leaders did not expect a resurrection. Numerous narratives suggest that many found the Resurrection a great surprise.

When Swinburne addresses the Resurrection explicitly, he reviews the NT accounts of post-Resurrection appearances, the empty tomb, and other detailed matters relevant to this extraordinary claim. With his view that this evidence is of minimal value, he can significantly minimize the work of biblical critics, who, following in the tradition of David Strauss and Rudolf Bultmann, interpret the gospels so that "in the person and acts of Jesus no supernaturalism shall be suffered to remain; nothing which shall press upon the souls of men with the leaden weight of arbitrary inscrutable authority" (Strauss, A New Life of Jesus, 1865). This strategy allows Swinburne to gloss over the difficult issues deriving from the NT appearance and vision accounts, which all biblical exegetes now discuss seriously, indicating that they do not assess the prior probability for the Resurrection with anything like the high value for which Swinburne argues. These issues include: determining the order in which the appearances took place; the timing, location, and significance of the Ascension as a possible point in time when "appearances" stopped and "visions" began, since Luke and Matthew do not agree on details regarding the Ascension; the failure of people to recognize Jesus after his Resurrection, since various people who should have recognized him did not, including Mary Magdalena, Peter probably, and other disciples who obviously were acquainted with his physical appearance; the doubt that accompanied some of these encounters, which several gospels mention; the possibility that the form in which Jesus appeared varied, which the long (disputed) ending of Mark's Gospel explicitly says; the nature of the "seeing" that was involved when Jesus appeared, including the possibility that these "visual experiences" were no more significant than the "bright light" that Paul saw on the Damascus road; and so on. Swinburne remarks that, like early church fathers, we should interpret the Bible in the light of science, history, and established Christian doctrine (p. 159, but see all of chap. 11). The influential biblical critics who have advanced the critical scrutiny of the Bible fully accept the two requirements of science and history, but they baulk at the third. Swinburne's epistemic view of the probabilities associated with the Resurrection is wholly out of step with the epistemic sensibilities of all these critics.

The question, "Was Jesus God?" was an existential challenge for me for about forty years, and reading Swinburne's book has inevitably led me to review the long and torturous route by which I came to uniquely Christian faith. Having been reared in the home of a conservative and devout Protestant minister, I did not encounter biblical criticism until my first year of university. Bishop John Robinson's book, Honest to God (SCM 1963), was published that year and became widely discussed. His endorsement of a demythologized Christianity corresponded closely to my epistemic sensibilities, and I kept only a vague belief in a God who might never have acted significantly in human history, and the noble, egalitarian, Christian ethic. The biblical accounts of the Virgin Birth and Resurrection sounded like fables to me, and the evidence for them seemed very weak. The fact that Christian tradition and the creeds taught these made no (epistemic) impression on me. Moreover, the existence of the Church was no more impressive evidence for the Resurrection than the flourishing of the Mormon church (with an average annual growth rate about eight times larger than the Christian Church) was for the claim that Joseph Smith was directed to golden plates that yielded The Book of Mormon. I never expected to make the transition from "bare theism" to Christian theism in my lifetime, but I met visionaries whose reports of direct encounters with a being whom they identified as Jesus Christ made me reconsider my repudiation of the post-Resurrection appearance stories. Then I came across the Shroud of Turin, which seemed to bolster New Testament accounts of the Crucifixion. John Robinson changed his view before his death about the physical Resurrection of Jesus, seemingly because of the Shroud. My journey back to orthodox faith reached a climax in August 2000 when I experienced an epiphany while viewing the Shroud at one of its rare exhibitions in Turin. I had not gone for religious reasons, but the startling "locutions" were clear, and directed to my intellect: "The Resurrection is real, Phillip," and then, "If this man had such a remarkable end to his life, the extraordinary beginning ascribed to him is also possible." I do not expect anyone else to be moved by what I experienced, but it has opened up the view that religious knowledge is objective and largely personal, an implication of which is that probability values do not conform to domains in which knowledge is objective and public.

Many people I meet construe Christic visions and the Shroud as potentially having significant evidential force for uniquely Christian claims, but if Swinburne is right, their epistemic intuitions are mistaken. No simple solution exists for adjudicating disputes about epistemic intuitions at the level I am speaking about here, for these are particular claims. I take comfort in the thought that biblical critics (and others) see the probability values much as I do.