Ways a World Might Be: Metaphysical and Anti-metaphysical Essays

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Stalnaker, Robert, Ways a World Might Be: Metaphysical and Anti-metaphysical Essays, Oxford University Press, 2003, 304pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199251495.

Reviewed by John Divers, University of Sheffield and ARCHE AHRB Research Centre, University of St. Andrews


This very welcome collection contains Robert Stalnaker’s essays on the metaphysics of the modal, the intentional and the mental. More specifically, fourteen substantive essays are grouped under five sections: ways and worlds; carving up logical space (essentialism and supervenience); identity in and across possible worlds; semantics, metasemantics and metaphysics, and subjective possibilities. The emphasis throughout the collection is indeed on metaphysics and so it may be worth pointing out that the reader will not find collected here any of Stalnaker’s celebrated technical work in philosophy of language on such topics as counterfactuals, assertion and context-dependence. The collection contains two previously unpublished essays in which the author engages, respectively, with Frank Jackson on the significance of two-dimensional possible-worlds semantics (Ch.11) and with Thomas Nagel on the metaphysical puzzlement created by statements of self-identification (Ch.14). Other previously published essays are further developed. Thus, a previously published paper on impossible worlds (Ch.3) is substantially expanded, and technical appendices are added to the essays on supervenience (Ch.5) and on quantified modal logics with identity (Ch.8).

Even those most familiar with Stalnaker’s work in metaphysics will benefit substantially from reading his fine introductory essay. This essay identifies Quine as the bridge connecting the tradition of logical empiricism to different tendencies that are discernible within the contemporary analytic metaphysical scene. It also identifies the central themes of the collection so that the reader may trace these more easily through the subsequent essays. In this review I will summarize, and expand a little upon, these themes.

Stalnaker is certainly a leading contemporary metaphysician. But this collection reveals him as a philosopher who is far more ambivalent about metaphysics than his many interlocutors who are, typically, signed up for the uncompromising and ideologically motivated defence and practice of the discipline. Moreover, when Stalnaker overcomes his methodological qualms and enters the metaphysical fray, he is cautious in his claims and in his arguments. This is a careful, and highly skilful, philosopher who is happiest when drawing the subtle distinction, in pointing out what does not follow from what and – above all – in establishing the independence or separability of things that are easily conflated.

For Stalnaker the most pressing, pervasive and difficult separation that calls out to be made is that between metaphysical and semantic questions [16-19]. Metaphysics is about distinguishing possibilities; semantics (the theory of the intentionality of speech and thought) is about how we represent those possibilities. The broadly semantic questions are themselves, crucially, to be distinguished between those of descriptive semantics (what is the semantic value of expression e?) and those of metasemantics (in virtue of what is it the case that the value of e is whatever it is?) The deployment of this trichotomy – of metaphysics, metasemantics and (descriptive) semantics – enables Stalnaker to articulate what is distinctive about his own take on the 2-dimensional possible-world “semantic” apparatus [192-7; Ch.11]. Firstly, the 2D apparatus illuminates metasemantic questions and properly allows us to distance from our strictly philosophical concerns those questions of what the semantic value of a given type of expression is. Secondly, the 2D apparatus allows us to identify the intensional nature of the Kripkean phenomena of the necessary a posteriori and contingent a priori. However, the 2D apparatus will not support stronger philosophical ambitions such as the explanation of the Kripkean phenomena simply in terms of semantic facts about the languages we happen to use or any serious explanation of (the source of) a priority. The trichotomy also allows Stalnaker to articulate his provocative and illuminating claims about the significance of Kripke’s Naming and Necessity [15;171-87]. According to Stalnaker – and perhaps somewhat surprisingly for those who know the history of critical reaction to Naming and Necessity – it was Kripke’s great achievement to insist on the mutual separation of metaphysics, metasemantics and semantics. For it is that insistence which allows us to block various bad “cross-categorical” arguments – for example, those that proceed from (“Fregean”) premises about the semantic values of names to certain (anti-essentialist) metaphysical conclusions. Indeed, Stalnaker claims that we might consistently and profitably buy Kripke’s insistence on the careful discrimination of the three elements of the trichotomy while rejecting the views that Kripke himself commends on any of the three kinds of question. Thus, we might be in full possession of Kripke’s central insights while insisting on a Russellian descriptive theory of names in semantics, rejecting the causal theory of reference in metasemantics and adopting an anti-essentialist metaphysics [168]. Just what it is for metaphysical, metasemantic and semantic questions to be separable, and how they are separately to be pursued, are - as Stalnaker acknowledges [187 et passim] – difficult and subtle matters. But there are certainly a number of important insights that cluster round the trichotomy, and it is both self-effacing and generous of Stalnaker to find the general insight in Kripke.

Much of what is distinctive about Stalnaker’s work on modality can also be brought to the fore by paying attention to his insistence on the separability of distinct (kinds of) theses – and especially so if we look to the work of David Lewis as foil [6-8; Chs 1-4]. Stalnaker (famously) is an actualist or ersatz realist about possible worlds in contrast to Lewis’s genuine realist. Stalnaker holds that the many unactualized possible worlds are abstract actually existing objects, as opposed to concrete non-actually existing objects. Stalnaker also thinks of the possible worlds as ways the world might have been. But beyond this, and contra Lewis, Stalnaker has no ambitions to subject possible worlds to further explicit conceptual or ontological reduction. According to Stalnaker, the concept of a possible world is to be understood functionally, or implicitly, in terms of its role in the theory of representation and content [8 et passim]. And no further substantial ontological reduction of the possible worlds is offered [38-9]. It is particularly important that Stalnaker’s tolerance of the ontological identification of ways (a world might be) with properties is not to be tested by imposing any further substantive characterization of properties. For example, Stalnaker will not sign up to the identification of ways with universals since he is sceptical of the orthodox characterizations of universals (in terms of their being “wholly present” etc.) [9-10; Ch.4]. So far, then, the modal theories of Stalnaker and Lewis contrast significantly. But Stalnaker insists on the separation of various elements of Lewis’s theory of modality that are often conflated. Among these separate elements are: the semantic thesis that modal concepts are to be analyzed in terms of quantification over the worlds and their parts; the semantic theory that “actually”, and its cognates are indexical in character ; the metaphysical (ontological) thesis that there are many worlds, the (metasemantic) thesis that representation de re is achieved by means of counterparts; the metaphysical thesis that worlds have no common parts etc. [Ch.1-4]. Exploiting the separability of these theses, Stalnaker carves out a distinctive theory of modality which in many respects places him close to Lewis and distances him from the stereotypical or monolithic “actualist” with whom Lewis is so often (and so lazily) contrasted. Thus, for example, the actualist Stalnaker allows a role for counterpart theory in addressing the problems of transworld identity [Ch.6]; he finds no adequate motivation (in the theory of content or otherwise) to postulate the existence of impossible worlds in addition to possible worlds [Ch.3] and he is agnostic (neutral) about the extent of non-trivial essential properties that particulars have [Ch.4].

I will confine myself to one rather brief and quasi-critical comment on the picture of modal metaphysics that Stalnaker so develops. It is clearly Stalnaker’s view that commitment to possible worlds follows from commitment to the use of the possible worlds “framework”. Stalnaker also thinks that the possible worlds framework is analogous to the semantic framework for first-order logic both in terms of its salience qua best theory of the relevant data (modal talk/non-modal talk) and in calling for a functionalist interpretation of its key theoretical terms (“possible world”/”individual”) [168-71]. Naturally, then, Stalnaker, with many others, is inclined to think that the really important questions in modal metaphysics are engaged after commitment to a plurality of possible worlds is admitted and that we then discover the nature of modal reality by clarifying (explicitly or implicitly) the nature of the worlds. But there are many crucial points in this chain of reasoning at which we might be tempted to raise questions. And here is one such point that merits emphasis.

As Stalnaker properly notes, we can separate the conceptual (semantic) claim that modal locutions are to be analysed in terms of quantification over possible worlds from the metaphysical (ontological) claim that there are any (non-actualized) possible worlds [40]. Thus, full acceptance of the possible worlds semantic framework ought to be consistent with a metaphysical attitude of non-belief in the existence non-actualized possible worlds. It is not uncommon in other cases for philosophers to accept the orthodox quantificational semantics for a discourse (mathematics, microphysical theory or morals – say) while declining belief in the controversial entities in question. Such philosophers do so at the price of revising orthodox opinion about which sentences may be held true and, thus, various (literalist) error-theoretic and agnostic views of mathematics, microphysical theory or morals are born. So having taught us that we must be vigilant in separating semantic from metaphysical questions, and having so opened the door to the investigation of error-theoretic or agnostic positions about the modal, it is a pity that Stalnaker does not point us further in that direction or intimate why he thinks it unprofitable to proceed along it.

To summarize, however, this collection brings together important essays of consistently high quality by a leading contemporary metaphysician. The prospect of a collection offers the author the opportunity to take an overview of his work and to identify its core and unifying themes. And when this opportunity is taken, what is distinctive and demanding of our attention in the author’s work emerges more clearly and the work itself emerges with added significance. Robert Stalnaker has taken this opportunity, and so Ways a World Might Be is a collection which stands as a genuinely valuable addition to his previously published work and to the literature of contemporary metaphysics.