Ways to be Blameworthy: Rightness, Wrongness, and Responsibility

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Elinor Mason, Ways to be Blameworthy: Rightness, Wrongness, and Responsibility, Oxford University Press, 2019, 237pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198833604.

Reviewed by Chad Flanders, Saint Louis University


Elinor Mason has written a short, absorbing book on blameworthiness and responsibility. It is deeply engaged with the current literature, but not in a way that detracts from the overall story she has to tell. What's more important, the book seems to get things roughly right -- that is, it seems to describe what we do when we blame people: no small feat for a practice so messy and complicated as blaming. Mason closes her book by quoting P.F. Strawson's warning that it is easy to forget when we are engaged in philosophy what it is actually like to be "involved in our ordinary interpersonal relationships" (212). She has done an excellent job of remembering what our ordinary relationships are like.

Several key concepts orient Mason's book, but the two most prominent are what she calls "ordinary blameworthiness" and "detached blameworthiness." We blame people in the ordinary way -- or to put in another way, people are blamable in the ordinary way -- when a person fails to act subjectively rightly. So this means at least, when she is blamable, that a person is failing (in a key phrase for Mason) "by her own lights" (2, 5). But Mason's account is not subjective all the way down. An agent, to be blamable, must be trying by her own lights to live up to Morality, by which Mason means (following Susan Wolf) living up to the "True and the Good" (10, 209). A person is blamable in the ordinary way only if they are members of our moral community, that is, they have a good enough "grasp" of what Morality requires.

An important component of Mason's account of ordinary blame is that of trying. Agents who can be subject to ordinary blame won't always succeed in doing the right thing, but at least they should try. Trying links up subjective rightness and Morality. We try because doing right by Morality isn't just a matter of what we believe now, but of doing our best (i.e., trying) to match up with the demands of Morality (even when that is not fully accessible to us [55]). As Mason puts it, "belief is static whereas trying is dynamic, continuous." (50) But sometimes we can ourselves be blamed for being too static: for not just trying and failing, but also for failing to try (73).

Persons who are subject to ordinary blame have a grip -- sometimes an imperfect one -- on Morality. What about those who don't? For them, we can (at most) praise them in a detached way. They do not share our Morality, or perhaps they have no Morality. So we can't blame them in the ordinary way, because they aren't trying to live up to the demands of our Morality (115). But they are still agents, so we can blame them for doing wrong by Morality, even if we don't hold out any hope that they'll respond to our blame by showing remorse, or by changing their behavior. (113)

Mason ties her "detached blame" to Strawson's "objective attitude," but I think we should keep them distinct in a way Mason doesn't always (which ends up undercutting the novelty of "detached blame") (114-115). Strawson saw the objective attitude as something we take when we no longer are treating people as agents; we look at them as things to control or manipulate or simply avoid. Mason wants "detached blame" not to be objectifying, even though detached blame is less about communicating our blame and more about venting or signaling -- less about the agent blamed and more about us. The connection between detached blame and the objective attitude may really be more psychological than conceptual: those whom we start by blaming detachedly may be the same ones we end up objectifying (in Strawson's sense).

One of Mason's more compelling insights comes in her chapter on a "third sort of blameworthiness" in addition to detached blame and ordinary blame, what she calls "extended blameworthiness" (179). This sort of blameworthiness comes in cases where our actual responsibility for something is ambiguous, but we take responsibility for it anyway, and so hold ourselves out as blameworthy whatever the facts of the matter might show (180). We claim the inadvertent and unintended action, for example, as "our own," as part of ourselves, even to the point of feeling remorse over having done it (189). Such acts of taking responsibility are sometimes justified, Mason notes, not so much because they get at the truth of our responsibility -- in these cases, the truth is hard to discern -- but because of the role taking responsibility for our inadvertent acts has in our ordinary relationships. (I have tried to trace such an idea back to Adam Smith in Flanders 2006.)

It is usually a sign of praise for a book that one leaves it wishing the author had say more about this or that topic, and so it is with this book. I'll pick out three areas in particular.

First, although Mason does spend a little time talking about the difference between judging someone as blameworthy, blaming them, and punishing them (101), the discussion is brief, and one would think that whether we are to express our blame (as opposed to keeping it inside) is a key issue in our practices of blaming and praising. Moreover, it is one that could be important for understanding the difference between ordinary and detached blame. A judgment that someone is worthy of detached blame really does seem to involve an act of (overt) blaming -- as most of the point is about getting it off our chests or reaffirming the values we share with others (116, 122). So detached blaming may be outward and expressive in a way that ordinary blaming isn't, or at least doesn't have to be (and in this, detached blaming may be more like what we do when we punish as opposed to blame in the ordinary way).

Second, in her concluding chapter, Mason talks about how blame can be "patchy" (I do not recall her using this phrase earlier in the book) (211). We may find ourselves, she says, blaming people in an ordinary way for some aspects of their behavior, but in a detached way for others. But this may understate the "patchiness" of blame. Our reactions to people, and whether we are blaming them in the ordinary or detached way, will change over time even in regard to the same aspects of their behavior. Consider, for example, how our attitudes toward children might shift slowly from blaming them in the detached way to blaming them in the ordinary way, as they develop (see the discussion of this in Strawson 1962). Relevant here is Mason's idea of blaming "proleptically" -- blaming not because people are in our moral community, but because we are trying to draw them into it (157). Proleptic blame seems to capture something that is in between ordinary and detached blame (even as detached blame is between ordinary blame and the objective attitude), and is a stance we may take up from time to time towards those who may be wandering away from our shared Morality.

Finally, Mason only makes only passing references to forgiveness (in the index it is listed once, and that to a footnote). But forgiveness seems to be an essential part of our blaming practices, and even a necessary one. Indeed, forgiveness has a meaning similar in structure to Mason's idea of extended blameworthiness. Just as extended blameworthiness involves us taking responsibility for things that we may not truly be responsible for, so forgiving means absolving someone of blame for things that they are truly responsible for. It involves a similar sort of fiction. And both taking responsibility in an extended way and forgiving people have their justification in the role they play in maintaining interpersonal relationships. A person may really be blamable, but for the sake of our relationship with her, we do not blame and instead forgive. It would have been nice had Mason added forgiveness to her taxonomy of praise and blame, as there seems to be a place for it.

But these are minor quibbles, if they are quibbles at all. Mason writes in her introduction that she is engaged in a project that straddles ethics and moral responsibility, two disciplines that normally "function independently" of one another (3). The greatness of Strawson's essay on the reactive attitudes and indeed, of Smith's masterpiece The Theory of Moral Sentiments, is that they also bridged those two fields. Mason's book is a fitting addition to that tradition.


Flanders, Chad. 2006. '"This Irregularity of Sentiment": Adam Smith on Moral Luck,' in Eric Schliesser and Leonidas Montes, eds., New Voices on Adam Smith. Routledge. 193-218.

Strawson, P.F. 1962. 'Freedom and Resentment'. Proceedings of the British Academy 48:187-211.