Five years after the climax of #metoo, a surprising development is afoot: women’s submission is trending. The tradwife movement in Britain and the Christian US celebrates housewives submitting to their husbands “like it’s 1959,” as blogger Alena Kate Pettitt puts it. In a more ironic vein, TikTok videos about smooth-brained bimbo feminism encourage young women to give in to the objectification that society inevitably places on them. In such a landscape, the question arises: Why do so many women consent to their own submission? This is precisely the question guiding Manon Garcia’s book. Garcia’s answer is that femininity is itself structured as submissive, and hence women take pleasure in submission because it appears to be the best of their limited options.
The book is beautifully written and a delight to read. Originally published for a general audience in France, its expanded English edition takes a somewhat more academic approach without sacrificing accessibility. This places it in a class with recent English-language work in feminist philosophy that targets a general audience, including Kate Manne’s Entitled and Amia Srinivasan’s The Right to Sex. It is a provocative contribution to contemporary feminist philosophy that shines a light on submission, a phenomenon that Garcia suggests is commonly overlooked because it is uncomfortable for philosophers to think about. Why would anyone abdicate their freedom? And why have women so often been cast as the kind of human beings who naturally do so?
The book’s title is a nod to Simone de Beauvoir’s famous claim in The Second Sex that one is not born a woman, but rather becomes one. The French title, On ne naît pas soumise, on le devient, reproduces Beauvoir’s sentence nearly verbatim, swapping ‘submissive’ for ‘woman.’ For Garcia, to be a woman is to be submissive; specifically, it is “to be in a situation where submission appears as one’s destiny” (42). The analysis focuses on how patriarchal submission defines womanhood even in societies that do not force them into submission, since it is here that submission appears especially puzzling. Garcia thus focuses on women in Western societies that formally espouse equality between men and women.
The primary achievement of Garcia’s book is to offer a philosophical account of submission that avoids the false dilemma of essentialism versus constructionism (47). Garcia writes that “One can, and must, study female submission without presuming that there is something typically or naturally feminine in this submission” (6). Yet she also wants to emphasize the lived experience of women’s submission, rather than focusing exclusively on social structures of domination that construct women as submissive. Garcia achieves this alternative path using phenomenology, specifically Beauvoir’s version of it. After deftly contrasting Sigmund Freud and Jean-Jacques Rousseau with Catherine MacKinnon on the essentialism/constructionism debate, Garcia sets up the alternative she finds in Beauvoir: a phenomenological account of situation. Beauvoir’s concept of situation accounts for the dynamic relations between the individual and structural dimensions of submission (63), while also revealing how one becomes submissive through social and embodied practices of everyday living. Becoming submissive is not the expression of a submissive nature, but rather the result of a situation—including one’s facticity, body, and social and economic structures—that leads one to believe that submission is one’s destiny.
Garcia argues that women do not actively choose submission, but consent to the submission prescribed to them by social norms (187). The question then arises: what is submission? Garcia describes it as “the action or the attitude of the person who submits,” where to submit is to abdicate one’s freedom (17, 2). Submission is curious because it is an activity in passivity: it is an activity that renounces activity. It is a will to obey in the face of domination by another or, at minimum, the result of not actively resisting domination.
Heterosexual intimate relationships are of particular interest to Garcia, as they are “the ultimate locus” of women’s oppression by men (14). Submission appears primarily in interpersonal relationships, such as in taking up the mental load of the family, accepting the lion’s share of parenting duties, and consenting to an objectifying erotic relation to men. But lest one think that the book comes to Monique Wittig’s conclusion that a lesbian is not a woman, Garcia claims that women are not distinguished by whether or not they are submissive, but rather by how submissive they are (13). In its focus on the oppression involved in heterosexual intimate relations, Garcia’s book resonates with work in feminist love studies by Scandinavian feminist theorists Anna Jónasdóttir (1996) and Lena Gunarsson (2014), but takes a different approach in its phenomenological methods.
Another important achievement of the book is its offering an accessible approach to Beauvoir’s philosophy in relation to her interlocutors, including Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Martin Heidegger, G.W.F. Hegel, and Jean-Paul Sartre. While Beauvoir scholars are by now familiar with the profound import of Beauvoir’s interventions in phenomenology, ontology, and ethics due to the burgeoning interest in her philosophy in the US in the past few decades, broader philosophical and feminist audiences likely are not. Garcia’s achievement in this area has been especially important in France, where Beauvoir has been primarily considered a writer rather than a philosopher even recently. One reviewer has suggested that Garcia spends too much time setting up the discourses of Beauvoir’s interlocutors, but I disagree (White 2021); her sparkling yet rigorous exegeses are not only rhetorically engaging, but also important for laying the groundwork of the argument. Phenomenology is a challenging philosophical tradition, and unpacking key concepts from it in order to set up how Beauvoir enriches them is essential in order for Garcia’s book to be accessible to the many American philosophers not already familiar with this tradition, such as those trained in analytic feminism.
Garcia’s engagement with Beauvoir is faithful to her work and also highlights its relevance for present-day feminism, as Charlotte Knowles has noted in her exemplary review of the book (Knowles 2021). With regard to analysis of the lived experience of submission, however, some aspects could use clarification: a repetition of claims sometimes stands in for argument. Here, I’d like to focus on one aspect of the analysis, that of objectification.
For Garcia, women’s oppression designates their transformation into an Other through objectification, especially erotic objectification (157). Although Garcia does not explicitly spell out the relation between objectification and submission (are they synonymous? Is one a form of the other? Etc.), her analysis suggests that each is an abdication of freedom. While Garcia states that there is something active about this process, she also emphasizes that women’s objectification is always already done for them. Indeed, for her, this is the mark of being a woman (147–8). In Chapter 7, she outlines four different ways of thinking about the body that we may find in Beauvoir: the physiological body, the lived body, the accidentally objectified body, and the structurally objectified body. She views the fourth category as key to understanding women’s oppression: women’s objectification on a social level precedes their experience of their lived bodies. Garcia claims that “women are the only beings whose bodies already have a social meaning before they can even experience them” (132–3). Thus, non-women can only be ‘accidentally’ objectified, i.e., temporarily othered in contingent circumstances.
This claim is odd for two reasons. First, women do not constitute the only social group that is structurally objectified. While Beauvoir does suggest in The Second Sex that women’s otherness is unique in its persistence throughout history, she does not suggest that all other social groups are only accidentally objectified. She acknowledges that what Garcia calls structural objectification is present for racialized groups such as Black Americans (though this is not to say that her analysis on this point is satisfying, as scholars such as Kathryn Sophia Belle have pointed out (2014)). Another review has commented on the absence of intersectionality in this text, noting that “Garcia’s view of submission is white, Western, Cisgender and privileged” (White 2021). The analysis of objectification is one place where this clearly appears. While I take Garcia’s point that she has chosen to focus on women in Western societies, not all these women have only the experience of gendered objectification; and many non-women in Western societies also have the experience of structural objectification.
Second, and more broadly, the way that Garcia describes structural objectification does not suggest that it needs to be limited to oppressive objectification: she often writes of it in a way that sounds much more benign, even universal. By writing of structural objectification as having one’s body take on a social meaning before one can experience the body as lived, Garcia to my mind rather explains a feature of all human bodies. It is not just women, or even those from oppressed groups more broadly, whose bodies have social meanings before they can be experienced as lived bodies: humans come out of the womb already interpellated into given identities, with bodies to which others ascribe social identities well before they can build conscious self-relations to their own bodies. Isn’t to have a birth certificate marked M or F at birth to be structurally objectified? And, if so, wouldn’t all human bodies function as destinies, in Garcia’s sense (133)?
To be sure, Garcia sometimes specifies that she associates objectification with erotic objectification. Perhaps weaving this more consistently throughout the descriptions of structural objectification would resolve this second worry. However, I think there is a major resource in Beauvoir that could help here: Beauvoir’s notion of se faire objet, which recent English-language scholarship on Beauvoir has emphasized thanks to the work of Jennifer McWeeny. Se faire objet is to become an object, in the double reflexive sense of both actively making oneself into an object and being passively made into an object. It thus captures both the ways that women become complicit in their own objectification even though it is not their ‘fault,’ and Beauvoir’s unique approach to passivity and activity in relation to women’s oppression. Garcia defines submission as an “activity in passivity,” and notes that women often play an active role in their submission by consenting to it, even though such consent does not quite amount to a choice (162). Yet the text does not quite explain how activity and passivity are working together here. Beauvoir’s own notion of se faire objet can provide a solution to this ambiguity.
It seems to me that what distinguishes women from men for Beauvoir is not that their objectification precedes the experience they can have of their own bodies—since arguably this is the case for all people—but rather that their objectification is so persistent that it overshadows their relation to their own bodies. This begins in puberty and continues into adulthood, with Beauvoir writing about how little girls go from first having unproblematic relations to their own lived bodies to increasingly being encouraged to make themselves into objects (se faire objet). In this sense, the relation between the four types of embodiment that Garcia lays out is much more complicated than the analysis suggests, and women’s oppression cannot straightforwardly be located on the level of structural objectification. What gets lost in the claim about the social body appearing before the lived body is the nature of becoming, which is so key to Beauvoir’s phenomenology and is figured in the notion of se faire objet. While Garcia’s book already fascinatingly addresses many phenomena of women’s submission and objectification, it doesn’t quite culminate in the coherent account of submission promised at its outset, and there may be additional resources in Beauvoir’s Second Sex itself to help with this.
Overall, Garcia’s book is a fascinating provocation for contemporary feminism that deserves a broad readership. It illuminates Beauvoir as a philosopher whose phenomenological methods are crucial for understanding women’s oppression as they live it. In so doing, it also refreshingly suggests the richness of resources in the continental European tradition for mainstream feminist theory. Some key elements of the argument fall short of the book’s aims, and I think it would benefit both from further resources in Beauvoir’s work and additional engagement with other discourses. But I highly recommend the book to anyone invested in thinking about the status of women in the US today and in crafting new feminist theories and praxes for the future.
Belle, Kathryn Sophia (as Kathryn T. Gines). 2014. “Comparative and Competing Frameworks of Oppression in Simone de Beauvoir’s The Second Sex,” Graduate Faculty Philosophy Journal, Volume 35, Numbers 1–2.
Gunarsson, Lena. 2014. The contradictions of love. London and New York: Routledge.
Jónasdóttir, Anna G. 1994. Why women are oppressed. Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
Knowles, Charlotte. 2021. “We are not born submissive: How patriarchy shapes women's lives, Manon Garcia,” European Journal of Philosophy 29:1183–118.
Manne, Kate. 2020. Entitled: How Male Privilege Hurts Women. New York: Crown Press.
McWeeny, Jennifer. 2017. “The Second Sex of Consciousness: A New Temporality and Ontology for Beauvoir’s ‘Becoming a Woman,” in “On ne naît pas femme: on le devient”: The Life of a Sentence, ed. Bonnie Mann and Martina Ferrari. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
Srinivasan, Amia. 2021. The Right to Sex: Feminism in the Twenty-First Century. New York: Farrar, Strauss and Giroux.
White, Amy E. 2021. “Manon Garcia: We Are Not Born Submissive,” The Journal of Value Inquiry. First online: August 4, 2021.