Weakening Philosophy: Essays in Honour of Gianni Vattimo

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Santiago Zabala (ed.), Weakening Philosophy: Essays in Honour of Gianni Vattimo, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2007, 453pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773531437.

Reviewed by Brian Schroeder, Rochester Institute of Technology


While the name and thought of Gianni Vattimo is familiar to European philosophers, theologians, cultural and political theorists, and even the general public (he regularly writes commentaries for La Stampa, a major Italian newspaper in Turin, and was a member of the European Parliament), in North America he is comparatively little known outside the domain of continental philosophy. Yet he is the author of some thirty-two books and coauthor of another five, of which fourteen have been translated and published in English, and is regarded by many as one of today's most original and influential thinkers (if not the most, as another leading Italian philosopher, Pier Aldo Rovatti, attests). Vattimo is recognized principally for his philosophical approach known as il pensiero debole, or "weak thought," which for him has a positive connotation in its realization and affirmation of the present condition of existence, characterized by the increasing erosion of the traditional metaphysical and rational foundations of modernism. While this is indeed an expression of nihilism, he argues throughout the corpus of his work that nihilism need not be construed solely or at least primarily as reactive and destructive. Vattimo announces rather an "optimistic" nihilistic phase of intellectual and cultural realization that will lead to an actual ethical, social and political transformation. In the present postmodern scenario of rapidly changing values, belief systems, geopolitical boundaries and epistemological foundations, the project of one such as Gianni Vattimo is sorely needed. The publication of Weakening Philosophy: Essays in Honour of Gianni Vattimo is thus a cause for celebration. This collection of very fine essays not only further establishes Vattimo's rightful place in contemporary European philosophy, it also takes up his call to advance the crucial active and affirmative engagement with thinking and society.

Edited by Santiago Zabala, a former student of Vattimo's and presently a researcher in philosophy at the Pontifical Lateran University of Rome, Weakening Philosophy is comprised of twenty-three essays, including one by Vattimo, which, while referred to as a response in the editor's introduction, is actually an original essay both summarizing the trajectory of his thinking as a whole and addressing it in light of the philosophies of Theodor Adorno and Emmanuel Levinas. As the subtitle states, the book is basically a festschrift honoring Vattimo on the occasion of his seventieth birthday in 2006. Many of the contributors' names are in their own right quite distinguished and internationally well known. The book is divided into three main parts: "Weakening Metaphysical Power," "Weakening Metaphysical Methods" and "Weakening Metaphysical Beliefs." Following Zabala's very fine introduction to Vattimo's life and philosophy, the first part contains contributions by Umberto Eco, Charles Taylor, Giacomo Marramao, Wolfgang Welsch, Hugh J. Silverman, Reiner Schürmann and Pier Aldo Rovatti. The essays in part two are by Richard Rorty, Manfred Frank, James Risser, Jean Grondin, Rüdiger Bubner, Santiago Zabala and Paolo Flores D'Arcais. The last part is comprised of essays by Nancy K. Frankenberry, Fernando Savater, Jack Miles, Jeffrey Perl, Carmelo Dotolo, Teresa Oñate and Jean-Luc Nancy, followed by Vattimo's conclusion. In addition, Zabala has compiled the most complete bibliography to date of Vattimo's authored and edited books, both in Italian and English translation, interviews with him in Italian, English, German and Spanish, as well as a list of his articles and book chapters published in English. There is also an extensive and extremely useful list of secondary books and articles. The index only lists names, unfortunately, and thus its usefulness is limited, given the richness of the volume and the repeated reference to central concepts and themes relevant to weak thought. The editing is overall very good, although there are several noticeable glitches here and there (for instance, a somewhat humorous persistence in transforming either Emmanuel Levinas' nationality or gender -- he is referred to in the index as "Emmanuele" and elsewhere as "Emmanuelle"). A more serious and embarrassing instance occurs, however, in the opening page of an otherwise strong essay, in which the author draws the attention of the reader no less than three times to the misspelled title of Vattimo's Credere di credere (translated as Belief) -- rendered as Credo di credere -- and proceeds to expound on the different ways and meanings in which it could be translated, compounding the error by then stating that "languages … do matter in philosophy."

There are too many essays to summarize or comment on in the space of this review, but in order to give a sense of the volume's depth I will restrict my treatment to the contributions in each part that exhibit a more direct and sustained engagement with Vattimo's thinking. In part one, these are Wolgang Welsch's "The Human -- Over and Over Again," Reiner Schürmann's "Deconstruction is Not Enough: On Gianni Vattimo's Call for 'Weak Thinking,'" and Pier Aldo Rovatti's "Weak Thought 2004: A Tribute to Gianni Vattimo." Skillfully tracing a line of thought from Diderot and Kant to Nietzsche to Husserl and Heidegger, Welsch considers how Vattimo's thought relates to the anthropic thinking of modernism. Arguing that Nietzsche develops the anthropic figure as far as it is possible to do so, and that Heidegger remains bound to the modernist way of interpreting the human, Welsch concludes that Vattimo, following them, also stays within the context of the modernist conception of the subject even though he "imagines humanity and its situation in a nonconventional way" (98).

Schürmann's essay, written in 1984, is a response to a paper published the same year by Vattimo titled "Dialectics, Difference, and Weak Thought." Schürmann confronts the hermeneutics of weak thought in relation not only to Nietzsche and Heidegger but also Derrida and Foucault, posing a number of unsettling critical questions to Vattimo that remain guiding lines of inquiry more than twenty years later -- for example, whether "the weakness in il pensiero debole is bad weakness" insofar as it betrays a tendency to continue "to build ever new edifices of obligation under some ultimate representation"; and "[c]oncretely, how can Vattimo wish to distort metaphysics with, of all metaphysical fantasms, an ethic of values?" (128). Such probing queries are precisely the stuff of the very best philosophical reflection and Vattimo has assuredly taken them to heart, as evinced in part by his own essay in this book.

The coeditor with Vattimo of the 1983 groundbreaking volume Il pensiero debole (the translation is forthcoming with Columbia University Press), Rovatti provides a fascinating insight to both his own thinking and that of Vattimo through a series of comparisons and contrasts between his phenomenologically based and Marxist influenced approach and Vattimo's hermeneutics. Husserl was and remains, according to Rovatti, the decisive (and divisive) figure in his continuing dialogue with Vattimo. Despite the seeming parallels between Vattimo's later thinking of a "beyond" of hermeneutics, in the sense of further weakening any foundational thought -- this is precisely the positive meaning of nihilism for him -- Rovatti's own efforts to advance a "phenomenology beyond phenomenology," following the work of Jacques Derrida and his exchange with Levinas, were never embraced by Vattimo. This leads Rovatti in turn to ask the phenomenological questions that he states can and must be broached, "beginning with the very paradox of subjectivity": "Who is the subject of weak thought? Which characteristics can we attribute to it to explain how it functions?" (139). Rovatti concludes his reflections by turning to Derrida's "near identification between 'event' and 'alterity,'" finding in this paradoxical ability to "stand" in the event which is never our own an orientation that "is precisely the weakening we need in order to prepare a new idea of responsibility and in order to access a horizon 'yet to come'".  This horizon reflects the liberating capacity of weak thought already identified by Vattimo in 1983 as "not one point among the others but rather the place where the analyses of reality prove both their political and philosophical capacities" (145).

Most of the essays in part two are focused on the topic of hermeneutics and a number of them provide a detailed examination of Hans-Georg Gadamer's conception of hermeneutics and to a lesser degree of its impact on Vattimo's philosophy. As in the first part of the book, only three of the essays directly engage Vattimo's philosophy. In "Heideggerianism and Leftist Politics," Richard Rorty finds common ground with Vattimo in becoming "convinced … that philosophy should no longer aim at revealing the ultimate context of human existence -- a context that, while not merely biological, is nevertheless transcultural and ahistorical" (151). While rejecting Heidegger's philosophy on ethical grounds, Rorty nevertheless allows that the weak thought of Vattimo (who is deeply influenced by Heidegger and particularly by his account of the Ge-stell, as he makes patently clear in his essay) has a positive role to play in helping leftist politics to abandon Enlightenment rationalism. Reading Vattimo alongside such unlikely interlocutors as Thomas Kuhn, Karl Popper and Hilary Putnam, Rorty's interpretation of weak thought weaves a line of thinking between politics, ethics, the critique of metaphysics, and religious belief.

Jean Grondin gives us a thorough and intriguing analysis of Vattimo's philosophy as it is situated in the difference between a Nietzschean and Gadamerian approach to hermeneutics in "Vattimo's Latinization of Hermeneutics." The "latinization" refers to Vattimo's influential role, continuing the legacy of his teacher, mentor and friend Luigi Pareyson, in introducing the philosophy of Gadamer and hermeneutics in general to Italy (Truth and Method was translated by Vattimo in 1969). Weak thought is an avowedly hermeneutical approach to philosophy, and as is the case with all translation, the original text is altered not only through its reception into another language but also by its relation to the thinking surrounding its reception; hence, latinization in the same sense that Greek metaphysics was affected by its translation into Roman Christianity. Grondin's concern is "whether hermeneutics, and thus philosophy itself, must be seen as a form of nihilism" (205). To this end, one need ask why Gadamer resisted the postmodern tendency of many of his contemporaries of proclaiming a nihilistic hermeneutics. Grondin responds to his own question by pointing out that, for Gadamer, Nietzsche's philosophy did not assume the central role that it did for Vattimo; indeed, Grondin claims that Vattimo's association of a Nietzschean-Heideggerian outlook with Gadamer's philosophy was his mark of genius (207).

Returning to the political dimension invoked by Rorty at the beginning of part two, in "Hermeneutics as the Primacy of Politics" Paolo Flores D'Arcais emphasizes Vattimo's contention that hermeneutics has become the koiné of contemporary philosophical language, not only for metaphysical and epistemological reflection but also for thinking the political. The weakening of metaphysical foundational structures in nihilistic hermeneutics assumes an emancipating role for the philosopher, leading the way for realizing Marx's often quoted claim that a philosophy that does not become non-philosophy is useless -- in other words, for Vattimo, it is incumbent on philosophers to become politicians, which is "the most political choice today, because it is necessary from a democratic point of view, whereas becoming a career politician is only, politically speaking, 'second best'" (251). This is perhaps the most potent meaning of Vattimo's admonition that hermeneutics must go beyond hermeneutics, lest it fall prey to the totalizing, foundationalist tendencies of previous metaphysical formulations.

The essays in part three give witness to the current direction of Vattimo's thinking -- namely, his interest in the question and role of religion today. Again, as in the previous parts, three essays in particular engage Vattimo in a sustained manner. Despite the atheist tendency of postmodern philosophy, Vattimo has never hidden his Christian ground. He is, however, far from being a traditional believer and has long criticized the Roman Catholic Church for its abiding association of God with Truth and for its conservative social and political stances, particularly with regard to gender and sexuality issues. Indebted to René Girard's analysis of religion and victimization, Vattimo finds in the Bible examples of the very weakening that his earlier philosophical thinking disclosed. The concept of kenosis (the self-emptying, or weakening, of God) expressed in Philippians 2:6-8 thus takes on particular significance for him, lending support not only for his conviction that the theologically loaded metaphysics of the West necessarily leads to the secularization of contemporary society and thought, but also that the early Christian notion of agapé prefigures the antimetaphysical revolution embraced by weak thought. While Vattimo is not original in identifying the radical standpoint of kenosis, which was already articulated in Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit and given further impetus in the American death of God theology of the 1960s, most notably in the on-going work of Thomas J. J. Altizer, he has advanced this thinking by decisively connecting this essentially theological insight -- long overlooked by the tradition of orthodox belief -- with the language of contemporary hermeneutics. This has prompted Vattimo to assert, as Zabala notes, "the future of religion will depend on a position that is 'beyond atheism and theism'" (26).

In her essay "Weakening Religious Belief: Vattimo, Rorty, and the Holism of the Mental," theologian Nancy K. Frankenberry accentuates this perspective by critically parsing out some of the similarities and differences between the "cheerful nihilism" of Vattimo and the "genial pragmatism" of Rorty (276), who collaborated to publish The Future of Religion (2005), with respect to the perspectives of Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Derrida, Paul Tillich, Donald Davidson, Wallace Stevens and others. But what stands out most perhaps in Vattimo, for Frankenberry, is that:

by reading the history of philosophy through a religious perspective, rather than reading the history of Christianity through a philosophical lens, Vattimo is able to see love -- charity, caritas -- as the point of convergence between philosophy's downward path and the historical transmission of Christianity. As the message of the Christian gospel empties into philosophical nihilism, it finds its precise fulfillment and destiny. (274)

Taking up many of the same themes but striking a more philosophical tone, Carmelo Dotolo opens his "The Hermeneutics of Christianity and Philosophical Responsibility" with the demanding question put forth in Vattimo's work: "In the history of Being presented by postmodernity, does Christianity represent a chance for rethinking Being and rewriting the meaning of the philosophical vocation?" (348). Dotolo adroitly traces Vattimo's reading of the course of Western philosophy beginning with modernist metaphysics to its destined manifestation as postmodern secularism and subsequent weakening as nihilistic hermeneutics. Here is where the "return of religion" occurs for Vattimo, but now after the "experience" of the death of God announced by Nietzsche and Heidegger's thinking of the "last god" in the Beiträge as a thinking of religion without religion, or of God without God. Rather than signifying a simple rejection of Christianity, this reimagined religion is interpreted by Vattimo as the necessary and inevitable outcome of nihilism's historical unfolding of the internal "logic" of Greek-Christian metaphysics. Philosophy is thus rejoined in a radical fashion with religion through the realization of the initial weakening of metaphysical foundational structures in the early apprehension of the kenotic incarnation of Christ, requiring philosophy to assume the responsibility of recognizing "the eventuality of Being and the violence of metaphysical essentialism" and therein "the link between the history of salvation and the history of interpretation" (361).

Extending the theme of responsibility but inflecting it in a different direction, in her "The Rights of God in Hermeneutical Postmodernity" Teresa Oñate offers us an extremely nuanced account of Vattimo's thinking via a complex but effective wending through the history of philosophy and theology from its most ancient to its postmodern expressions. Ever attentive to the relation between metaphysics and violence that has consistently characterized Vattimo's work, and finding forceful and poignant expression in his concluding essay in the volume, "Metaphysics and Violence," Oñate resonates the more moderate, weak -- or to use her term, "debolist" -- approach espoused by Vattimo, advocating "a leap (Schritt züruck) to the past-future made possible in the sense of language that is open for the not-spoken and the not-thought" that does not "supercede" or "exclude" the "elementary and abstract violence" of Platonist metaphysics but instead seeks to "subordinate it and reorient it toward the realm of spiritual actions" (399).

In "Christianity as Religion and the Irreligion of the Future," Fernando Savater draws our attention to the following quotation from Vattimo's Belief: "Today there are no longer strong, plausible philosophical reasons to be atheist, or at any rate to dismiss religion" (298). The envisioned religion that Vattimo invites us to consider at the conclusion of his own contribution to this rich and provocative book is a "path of 'moderation' and of listening, one that does not present the schema of foundation again and again but resigns itself to it, accepts it as destiny, distorts it, and secularizes it" (421).

As mentioned above, Weakening Philosophy is for the most part a festschrift and most of the contributions read as such. After the obligatory acknowledgment of Vattimo's philosophy and generally superficial engagement with the principal tenets of his thinking -- weak thought, his grounding in the philosophies of Nietzsche and Heidegger, the critical distinction between the Verwindung ("distortion") and Überwindung (overcoming) of metaphysics, hermeneutics, nihilism, the "death of God," kenosis -- most of the essays are concerned with the particular philosophies or philosophical interests of the contributing authors. Several were likely written independently of this collection and seem to have been included in it either on the basis of name status, friendship, or their prior engagement with Vattimo's philosophy. That said, as one would expect from such a notable list, the essays are of uniformly high quality and offer insightful and frequently important and original reflections on a range of topics, even if they often only marginally engage Vattimo's thought per se. Even if the volume as a whole does not quite give full measure to the range and depth of Vattimo's philosophy, it is nevertheless an important and valuable collection in its own right. And for those newly acquainted with Vattimo, his own essay is a stunning contribution, and in conjunction with Zabala's introduction provides an exceptionally succinct and clear exposition of "weak thought." These two pieces and the bibliography alone make the acquisition of this volume worthwhile.