Weakness of Will and Practical Irrationality

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Sarah Stroud and Christine Tappolet, eds., Weakness of Will and Practical Irrationality, Oxford, 2003, 317pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199257361.

Reviewed by Patrick Henry Yarnell, University of Colorado, Colorado Springs


This book contains eleven articles and includes works by some of the leading theorists in the field of practical rationality. It also contains an introduction (by editors Stroud and Tappolet) that succinctly summarizes the main themes, arguments, and concerns of the text. Despite much overlap and interconnectedness, the book’s articles can be categorized in terms of three general strategies/aims of the contributing authors:

(1) To illuminate the implications that akrasia (and other specific sorts of putative practical breakdown) have for general theories of practical rationality,
(2) To identify the mental entities and capacities we need to postulate in order to explain practical failures (and successes) like weakness (or strength) of will, and
(3) To clarify the nature of akrasia, etc., and explain how rifts between evaluation and motivation arise.

Contributions by Sara Stroud (Ch. 5, “Weakness of Will and Practical Judgement”), Sergio Tenenbaum (Ch. 6, “Accidie, Evaluation, and Motivation”), Gary Watson (Ch. 7, “The Work of the Will”), Duncan MacIntosh (Ch. 9, “Prudence and the Temporal Structure of Practical Reasons”), and Ronald de Sousa (Ch. 11, “Paradoxical Emotion: On Sui Generis Emotional Irrationality”) all fit into the first category. Stroud, Tenenbaum, and Watson individually conclude that, contrary to common opinion, occurrences of akrasia/accidie support internalism, the view that there is a necessary connection between practical judgments (i.e. judgments of the form “ø-ing would be the best course of action”) and intention/action. MacIntosh argues that a broadly Humean approach to practical rationality would, contrary to Thomas Nagel’s assertions, promote coherence of attitudes over time. De Sousa considers examples of emotional antinomies, seemingly inconsistent clashes of attitudes, and concludes that our actual attitudes are the only arbiters of conflicts between practical and theoretical rationality.

Articles by Richard Holton (Ch. 2, “How is Strength of Will Possible?”), Christine Tappolet (Ch. 4, “Emotions and the Intelligibility of Akratic Action”), Gary Watson (Ch. 7, “The Work of the Will”), and Joseph Heath (Ch. 10, “Practical Irrationality and Decision Theory”) fall into the second category. Holton argues we need to postulate more than just beliefs and desires, namely a distinct faculty of will power, in order to plausibly explain our capacity to remain resolute in the face of temptation. Tappolet contends that emotions, understood as attitudes that are irresponsive to higher-order cognitive faculties, offer the most promising explanation of akratic behavior. Watson offers an explanation of how internalists can distinguish between decision and practical assessment, despite the necessary link between the two, and thus accommodate a genuine conception of will within their framework. Heath, upon examining human tendencies in ultimatum games, suggests that standard decision theory, which casts agents’ deliberations in a purely consequentialist light, should be revamped so as to more accurately reflect the deontological considerations that help produce our decisions under such circumstances; utility functions should be replaced with, what he calls, value functions.

Papers by Michael Smith (Ch. 1, “Rational Capacities, or: How to Distinguish Recklessness, Weakness, and Compulsion”) and Philip Pettit (Ch. 3, “Akrasia, Collective and Individual”) belong in the third category. Smith distinguishes weak-willed from compulsive behavior in terms of the capacity to form desires in accordance with one’s practical judgments. Weak-willed agents have this capacity, compulsive agents don’t. Then, Smith gives this capacity a possible-worlds analysis. Pettit attempts to clarify the nature of akrasia in the individual by examining how akratic behavior might arise in collectives of individuals.

Ralph Wedgwood’s article (Ch. 8, “Choosing Rationally and Choosing Correctly”) does not easily fit into any of the above categories. Nonetheless, he is concerned with a fundamental issue – the debate between recognitionalists and constructivists. “Constructivists believe that there are truths about what is a good thing for one to do because there are rational procedures for making choices—whereas according to the recognitional view, there are rational procedures for making choices because there are truths about what is a good thing for one to do…” (209). Wedgwood considers the normative-question argument against recognitionalism - the idea that the view is deeply flawed because “for every substantive concept of a `good thing to do’, one could always ask, without revealing any insanity or lack of intelligence, `But why should I always choose options that are good… in that way?’“ (216). But such questions, according to the recognitional view, would seemingly indicate that the agent is irrational, beyond the power of rational persuasion altogether, because considerations of what is valuable are the only means of rational persuasion (213). In response, Wedgwood develops a formal (abstract) recognitional view that, he thinks, offers an adequate response to the normative question argument. He then turns the argument on the constructivists.

In general, the book isolates many fundamental issues and arguments, and some authors, especially, de Sousa, Watson, Heath, and Tappolet effectively use relevant (and often perplexing or paradoxical) findings from empirical psychology to support their positions. The book is a valuable resource for anyone interested in the nature of rational action.

I would like to end my review with some specific evaluative considerations concerning Stroud’s argument for internalism and McIntosh’s broadly Humean view of rationality:

The reality of akratic behavior, where the agent intentionally acts contrary to her own practical judgments, motivates Stroud to qualify her account of the connection between such judgments and intention/action. On her qualified view, the link between practical judgments and intention/action is necessary for those who are rational (137). This qualified view, thus, can accommodate akratic behavior.

Then Stroud considers the “possibility” of global akrasia, where agents always fail to act in accordance with their practical judgments. Not only, she argues, is such a world possible, according to externalism, but also “these beings who are completely uninfluenced by the conclusions they reach about what they have most reason to do are still practically rational agents; they are simply rational agents with a different inventory of desires than is typical of human beings hereabouts” (144 – 45). Internalists, on the other hand, might doubt the possibility of such a world and would certainly condemn such agents as hopelessly irrational. With regard, then, to their handlings of global akrasia, internalism is the more plausible view (145).

I find Stroud’s global akrasia argument somewhat compelling. Nonetheless, one has to wonder if the externalist might find a way to, as it were, sail between Skylla and Charybdis and offer an account according to which, while there is no necessary connection between practical judgments and the intentions/actions of rational agents, such global akrasia is not possible. Perhaps externalists could offer the following: A necessary condition for agency is that our practical judgments typically, or at least occasionally, (but not always) reflect what we desire (perhaps because, otherwise, we would be too schizophrenic to be classified as individuals). When our practical judgments accurately reflect our all-things-considered desires there is, even on the externalist view, a necessary connection between practical assessment and intention/action, for “appropriate” intentions/actions would be instrumental to the satisfaction of those desires reflected in the assessments. If, for example, one’s judgment that one should help those in dire need accurately reflected one’s desire for the well-being of such individuals, then one would be rationally required, according to the externalist, to act in a helpful manner because so acting would be instrumental to the satisfaction of the underlying desire. However, in those cases where there is a rift between one’s assessment and one’s desires, there would be no necessary connection between practical assessment and action/intention, even for rational agents, for such actions and intentions would not be instrumental to the satisfaction of the agent’s desires. On such a view global akrasia would not be possible. Beings who always suffered a schism between practical judgment and desire would not be agents; . fortiori they would not be rational agents.

Not only would such an externalism offer a response to Stroud’s global akrasia argument, it could seemingly handle “rational akrasia” better than Stroud’s internalism. According to Audi (1990), Arpaly (2000), MacIntyre (1990), and Tappolet (115 – 117), the possibility of rational akrasia presents itself when an agent’s practical judgment does not reflect her (normative) reasons; perhaps the judgment fails to represent her overall desires and interests. MacIntyre uses the example of Huckleberry Finn, who fails, from concern for Jim’s welfare, to act upon his practical judgment that he ought to return Jim to his “owner.” Stroud would seemingly have to condemn Huckleberry Finn’s action as irrational. Upon concluding what he ought to do, he is, on Stroud’s view, rationally required to act in the “appropriate” manner. But this would be exactly the sort of case where the externalist would deny a necessary connection between practical judgment and rational action/intention and allow for the rationality of Huckleberry’s akratic behavior.

Now, let’s consider MacIntosh’s Humean view of rationality. First, he uses examples of self-effacing reasons, i.e. cases in which desires rationally require their own renunciation because that is the best means to their satisfaction, to argue against Nagel’s approach to practical rationality, which asserts that reasons are timeless and impersonal, i.e. “that something can be a reason for a given agent at one time just if it could be a reason for any agent any time” (231). Then MacIntosh develops his Humean approach to rational action: One’s action is rational if and only if it is instrumental to the satisfaction of one’s rational desires. Rational desires, on this view, are either those desires that are (broadly speaking) instrumental to the satisfaction of one’s previous (rational) desires or one’s original rational desires themselves. One’s rational desires are either the same as one’s earlier (rational) desires or they are “for things conducive to, entailed by, or partly constitutive of,” one’s antecedent (rational) desires (236, also 238, 240, 242). All rational desires, then, are instrumentally justified, except one’s original set: “I assume,” says MacIntosh, “the first set of values one ever holds counts as rationally permissible by virtue of there being no values one held previously with reference to which one’s acquiring the first set was anti-maximizing. Thereafter any values are permissible just if forming them was not anti-maximizing on the values held just previously” (239, footnote 12). Ultimately, the rational status of one’s current desires is determined by whether they are appropriately connected to one’s original set.

An advantage of MacIntosh’s view is that it, contrary to traditional Humean instrumentalism, i.e. the view that all rational actions promote the satisfaction of one’s current desires (whatever they may be), offers a response to Nagel’s accusation that the Humean model allows for radical shifts in desire such that one’s “rational” actions might be absurdly incoherent over time. The fact that, on MacIntosh’s view, new desires must be vetted by the old ensures some coherence of attitudes over time, at least for rational agents. A rather startling implication of MacIntosh’s view—one that he is willing to accept—is that there is no general obligation/reason to be prudent, no reason to act now so as to promote the satisfaction of your future desires: “Unless one has a present aim to advance one’s future aims, doing these things is irrational; only one’s present aims can directly be one’s reasons” (232).

I share MacIntosh’s skepticism of the view that all practical reasons are timeless and impersonal. Nonetheless, the idea that my current rational requirements are ultimately determined by the desires that I had at the dawn of my existence strikes me as hopelessly implausible. What about my desires for sexual gratification, to attend symphonic concerts, to acquire a better understanding of Kant’s moral theory? It’s certainly not clear that such desires are “appropriately” related to the set of desires I had at, say, ages 4 or 5.

MacIntosh explicitly addresses the advent of sexual desire: “While this change of preferences is not recommended, since it is anti-maximizing on one’s prior preferences, neither is it forbidden, since that would violate the rule that, for it to be true that you (rationally) ought to do something, it must be true that you can do it. In puberty, you can’t prevent the desire changes. So, they are merely non-rational; and, once they happen, one rationally must advance one’s then preferences” (240, footnote 14). This won’t do for a variety of reasons. First, it is not clear that the ought-implies-can rule applies to rationality. We call compulsive agents irrational despite the fact that they could not do otherwise. Second, just because one has a desire for sex does not mean that one has to act on that desire. The ought-implies-can principle, if it applies at all, exonerates only the desire for, not the pursuit of, sex. Further, in cases where one can resist acting upon non-rationally grounded desires, that is what MacIntosh recommends “for that is what would maximize on the value it is rational for [one] to hold” (239). Third, this view seems to imply that, if we could prevent the onset of sexual desire in a way that did not interfere with the satisfaction of other desires, we should do so.

Those who are skeptical of the view that the same reasons apply to everyone, everywhere, and at all times would, I think, do well to reject MacIntosh’s view in favor of a sophisticated constructivist account that can simultaneously avoid commitment to timeless and impersonal reasons, allow room for prudence as a duty, demand coherence of attitudes over time, and easily accommodate the rationality of desires of normal adults. The view that I favor is that one’s reasons are determined by what one would value upon full information and rational reflection, where full-information includes, among other things, systematic non-manipulative exposure to possible sources of satisfaction. Such a view, I believe, could meet all of these objectives.


Arpaly, N. (2000) “On Acting Rationally Against One’s Best Judgement.” Ethics, 110: 488 – 513.

Audi, R. (1990) “Weakness of Will and Rational Action.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 68: 270 - 81.

MacIntyre, A. (1990) “Is Akratic Action Always Irrational?” in O. Flanagan and A. Rorty (eds.), Identity, Character, and Morality: Essays in Moral Psychology. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 379 – 400.