Weakness of Will from Plato to the Present

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Tobias Hoffmann (ed.), Weakness of Will from Plato to the Present, The Catholic University of America Press, 2008, 316pp., $59.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780813215204.

Reviewed by Byron Williston, Wilfrid Laurier University


An agent acts acratically -- displays weakness of will -- when she behaves in a manner that runs contrary to her considered judgement about what she should do (this is "open-eyed" or "strict" akrasia). Although the phenomenon is nowadays treated by philosophers largely in abstraction from its historical development, akrasia has been a persistent concern of philosophers throughout the history of philosophy. The chief merit of Hoffmann's anthology, therefore, is to give readers a sense of just how often this theme has been discussed philosophically since the time of Socrates. Historically, the two touchstones for our understanding of akrasia have been Socrates and St. Paul. The Socratic position is intellectualist and eliminativist: the fact that virtue is knowledge makes akrasia theoretically impossible and therefore actually non-existent. The Pauline view is diametrically opposed to this. For Paul, akrasia is not only a theoretical possibility; it is in some sense inevitable for post-lapsarian humanity, although its effects can be mitigated. Hoffmann's collection shows that every thinker who discusses akrasia, from Socrates to Alasdair MacIntyre, at least tends towards either the Socratic or the Pauline view. But there is much else of interest in these essays. Here is a brief summary of each.

Kenneth Dorter, in "Weakness and Will in Plato's Republic", argues that Plato's texts present two, apparently incompatible, accounts of akrasia. The first is found in early dialogues like the Protagoras, Charmides, Laches, and Meno. The view in these texts is intellectualist. The second view is found in Book 4 of the Republic. There, Socrates argues that we may know what is good, but fail to be moved by it because we are not able to master our temptations or fears. Dorter's argument is that the intellectualist reading of Plato is in fact consistently maintained throughout the corpus, but that this is apparent only if Book 4 of the Republic is read in the light of its later books, especially Book 7. The key is an ambiguity in the concept of knowledge: "knowledge is virtue, and invulnerable to weakness of will, only insofar as the kind of knowledge meant is wisdom." (17) So only the wise person has a grip on reality sufficient to defuse the power of arational forces. Plato says for instance that a full understanding of the nature of the soul would see it as "like an eye that cannot be turned from light to darkness except together with the whole body." (14) Here the body -- together with all of its forces and drives -- is taken up into the perception of truth and goodness, an idea which appears to provide little scope for psychic anarchy.

Terence H. Irwin, in "Aristotle Reads the Protagoras", usefully compares Aristotle's treatment of incontinence across two texts, the Magna Moralia (MM) and the Nicomachean Ethics (NE). His conclusion is that Aristotle's position becomes more anti-Socratic as he moves from the first to the second. In the MM, Aristotle is willing to agree with Socrates that the akrates does not possess knowledge of what he is doing while he does it. In the NE, by contrast, the akrates possesses some particular knowledge. The akrates does indeed formulate the "good syllogism," all the way through. So why does he act incontinently? The account still focuses on the role of the particular premise. Although he "believes the proposition that is the content of the minor premise" this belief does not "serve as a premise of the good syllogism". That is, the akrates does not "combine" the particular premise with the other elements of the inference (39).

In "Plotinus on Weakness of the Will: The Neoplatonic Synthesis", Lloyd P. Gerson maintains that Plotinus incorporates a large measure of Peripatetic and Stoic claims concerning the relations between reason and the passions into his Platonist account of our moral psychology. For Gerson, the key failure of the akrates has to do with an inability to answer the question "Who am I?" That is, the person displaying weakness of will has succumbed to an understanding of himself rooted in his status as a desiring, embodied self. But desire presents only an illusory good. Rational desire, by contrast, is aimed at the unqualified good, as Aristotle had claimed.

James Wetzel, in "Body Double: Saint Augustine and the Sexualized Will", has it that not lust, but self-deception, is the impediment to Augustine's conversion. What he is deceived about is contained in his wish for a perfect, immortal body. One way of seeing this is as a conversion away from a key doctrine of Greek ethics: that there is a meaningful distinction between self-restraint and virtue, where the former is good though conflicted and the latter is good and unconflicted. Augustine now sees that self-restraint is the best we sons of Adam can do because "sexual habit" is an ineliminable feature of our nature and it always pulls against the apprehension of good or God. This is because we humans have, ineluctably, "chosen knowledge of the flesh." (81) So Augustine is interested in a bigger problem than mere weakness of will. The upshot is that akrasia is, for us, unavoidable and the discovery that we cannot avoid it is what opens the door to the theology of grace, and also the refutation of Pelagianism.

No philosopher in the Christian era -- perhaps any era -- gives more attention to weakness of will than St. Thomas. In "Thomas Aquinas on Weakness of Will", Denis J. M. Bradley presents Thomas's careful analysis of Aristotle's ethics, one that concentrates on the practical syllogism. Thomas follows Aristotle in much of his discussion but parts ways with him on an important issue. Whereas for Aristotle, agents do not choose to act incontinently, for Thomas they do. However, they do not choose the action as such but rather the passion that is its proximate cause or psychological support. Thus, Thomas's ultimate position appears to endorse some aspects of the Socratic position.

One does not expect to see an analysis of the views of Henry of Ghent in a volume like this, but Tobias Hoffmann's "Henry of Ghent's Voluntarist Account of Weakness of Will" is a welcome addition. Hoffmann argues that weakness of will is fundamental to Henry's moral psychology. Henry maintains that the phenomenon is possible because of the innate freedom of the human will. But although this radical voluntarism makes incontinence intelligible, Hoffmann rightly criticizes Henry for failing to provide an explanation of what goes on in us when we reject a clearly perceived good. This is not equivalent to claiming that akratic decisions are uncaused: they are rooted in our motivations. But Henry cannot adequately explain what appears to be a perverse action of the will.

Another wonderfully unexpected participant in this historical dialogue is Dante. Giuseppe Mazzotta, in "Dante and the Wounded Will", shows that Dante begins with the fundamental Christian premise that the will is wounded because of original sin. But for Dante the ultimate repairer of the will is art. Dante urges on his readers the notion that "in poetry the voluntary and the involuntary -- the willed and the inspired -- converge". (142) But how does this happen and what prevents it from happening? The chief culprit is the will that believes itself to be the fully sovereign centre of agency. This failing is exemplified in the lament of Francesca, from Canto 5 of the Inferno. Francesca is guilty of an "esthetic voluntarism." She extols the values of courtly love. But because this life is fundamentally narcissistic and fantastic, it remains in the realm of the imaginary. Thus the life of desire symbolizes the poverty of pure will: both involve an essential incompleteness since reason's guidance is missing. Art, by contrast, seeks to make the self whole, and so presumably to reduce the possibilities for weakness of will. This is because it is both a reason-guided kind of work and a harnessing of the imagination and passions.

In "Montaigne's Marvelous Weakness", Ann Hartle presents us with another eliminativist account of akrasia. But whereas the Socratic position is eliminativist in virtue of the claim that weak wills are defined out of existence -- since their existence would run afoul of the claim that knowledge of the good compels good action -- Montaigne proceeds differently. Hartle begins by showing how Montaigne thinks of virtue. If we think of a three-place hierarchy of moral types -- perfect virtue, imperfect virtue and natural virtue -- Montaigne locates himself on the lowest rung. That is, Montaigne's virtue is neither unerring and habitual (perfect) nor imposed on his unruly inclinations by force (imperfect). Instead, whatever virtue is present in him is merely "accidental and fortuitous." (160) For this reason, as Montaigne notes, "the very names of goodness and innocence are … to some extent terms of contempt." (160) This lowest level of virtue is then equated by Montaigne with "weakness" and it is a condition he embraces happily and unequivocally.

John C. McCarthy, in "Descartes's Feeble Spirits", uncovers the various strands of Descartes's thinking on the notion of "feeble spirits", a term he employs occasionally in the early Discourse on Method and much more frequently in his culminating work, The Passions of the Soul. McCarthy rightly sees the primary contrast of moral types in the Passions as one between the generous soul and those who have not attained this "virtue." The generous have two key features. First, they know that nothing truly belongs to them but the "freedom to dispose their volitions." Second, they feel within themselves the "firm and constant resolution" to use the will well. It is the second feature -- the feeling of resolution -- that most sharply distinguishes the generous from the non-generous and thus gives us the clue to the Cartesian understanding of weakness. For the Descartes of the Passions, the key evil in practical life appears to be irresolution. Were we entirely in their thrall, the passions would cause us to waver from one moment to the next, as passion-arousing objects assail us. This is the condition of feeble spirits, whose affliction comes in degrees depending on the amount of willpower they are able to summon to combat the passions.

No historical treatment of akrasia would be complete without an analysis of Kant. Thomas E. Hill Jr., in "Kant on Weakness of Will", endeavors both to locate Kant's theory of weakness of will in the larger context of his action theory and to show how the view differs from some of his predecessors, notably Hobbes and Hume. Kant thinks of moral weakness in contrast to strength of will. For Kant this means fulfilling one's duties in the face of contrary inclinations and temptations. For Hill the key puzzle in interpreting Kant on this question is to make sense of this contrast without succumbing to the temptation of thinking of strength of will on fully analogous lines with physical strength. He proposes that we think of weakness in two distinct forms. On the first one, we act weakly when the will we have to do what is right is "somewhat vague and relatively inexplicit regarding its implications." (228) The second dimension is more directly related to the idea of strength. Here, the agent has a clear view of how general principles are meant to fit the circumstances but he has a tendency to will the good only half-heartedly, irresolutely.

Tracy B. Strong, in "Nietzsche, the Will to Power, and the Weak Will", argues that the idea of character is central to Nietzsche. Strong's discussion of the parable of the lamb and the eagle from the Genealogy of Morals illustrates this. For Nietzsche the two figures represent fundamentally distinct types -- characters -- whose ways of interpreting the world come into violent collision. Here is where the key to Nietzsche's views on weakness of will is found. The lamb is paradigmatically weak of will because its valuations proceed from negation, the negation of the values of the bird of prey. The eagle, by contrast, is strong precisely because its valuations are the unreflective product of its own nature. On the basis of this analysis we get a Nietzschean definition of weakness of will: the weak-willed person has a "dialectical relationship to someone or something other, to a fixed and general framework." (244)

Alfred R. Mele, in "A Libertarian View of Akratic Action", gives an account of weakness of will representative of current debates in analytic philosophy. Mele argues for a form of libertarianism that is able to embrace the phenomenon of luck, what he calls luck-embracing libertarianism or LEL. An advocate of LEL will grant that "if, in the actual world, an agent decides at t to A, whereas in another possible world with the same laws of nature and the same past, he decides at t not to A, then the cross-world difference at t is just a matter of luck." (275) Nevertheless the agent who As can be held morally responsible for his action because the presence of luck does not preclude his having acted freely at t. Mele's larger purpose is to show that this version of libertarianism is able to accommodate strict akratic actions, i.e., actions that are free and contrary to a belief that the agent has at the time of action to the effect that it would be best, all things considered, not to act in this manner.

Finally, Alasdair MacIntyre, in "Conflicts of Desire", is helpful in exposing the shortcomings of rational decision theory. The latter has two major faults. First, it makes no room for objects of desire that we (may) have reason to desire. Second, it assumes that practical decision making cannot get going until practical inconsistencies are overcome, whereas the resolution of these inconsistencies is one of the achievements of genuine practical reasoning. For MacIntyre it is "normal" to be constantly buffeted by desires of varying strengths, and moral progress consists in shaping these desires in accordance with a conception of our good. But "occasional lapses from what we know to be best" are to be expected (286). So, these lapses are not signs of weak will but rather of strong desires, desires that have, so far, been only imperfectly directed. All of us learn how to shape our desires in the course of temporally extended dialogues with ourselves and others about the good life. But this process is never fully complete. The important thing is to treat our lapses as genuine failings and to seek to steer clear of them in the future, rather than "failing to take note of them or actively assenting to them." (291)

My summary of these fine essays scarcely does justice to the variety of themes they cover and the richness with which these themes are treated. Hoffmann is to be congratulated on assembling a first-rate collection, one which will broaden immeasurably our understanding of what is, after all, probably an inescapable fact of the human condition.