Wealth, Commerce and Philosophy: Foundational Thinkers and Business Ethics

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Eugene Heath and Byron Kaldis (eds.), Wealth, Commerce and Philosophy: Foundational Thinkers and Business Ethics, University of Chicago Press, 2017, 437 pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226443850.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Moriarty, Bentley University


The purpose of this book is to show how the insights of historically important philosophers (construed broadly) can illuminate issues in business ethics (also construed broadly). It is a welcome addition to the literature: it calls our attention to many ideas and arguments that are underappreciated in, or absent from, current discussions. But it is uneven: some chapters are outstanding, others less so. The book also covers some views better than others. There is more argument in favor of the pursuit of wealth than against it; there is more argument in favor of free markets than against them. For this reason, readers interested in the historical sources of "pro" views about wealth and markets will find this volume especially useful.

The book includes 20 chapters on thinkers from Homer to Amartya Sen. In between we find Hesiod, Aristotle, Confucius, Mencius, Augustine, Aquinas, Ibn Khaldun, Hobbes, Locke, Mandeville, Montesquieu, Hume, Smith, Kant, Tocqueville, Mill, Marx, Hayek, Friedman, and Rawls. The book's goal is to glean from these figures "insights, arguments, or concepts relevant to an inquiry into business ethics, whether understood in terms of the morals . . . of commerce and commercial societies or in terms of conduct . . . within business itself" (p. 4). This provides an organizing principle for my review. I do not consider whether the chapter adds to our understanding of the philosopher in question. In many cases, I am incapable of assessing that. I ask whether it presents the philosopher's views in a way that is helpful for thinking through ethical issues in business.

It is understandably difficult to decide who to include in books like this -- who the "foundational" thinkers are. Heath and Kaldis take a broad view of history -- the chapters span a period of almost 3000 years -- and many of their choices are thoughtful and appropriate. But a few strike me as suboptimal. There is a chapter on Confucius and Mencius and another on Ibn Khaldun, the 14th century Arab philosopher. The other 18 focus on European or American thinkers. One wonders if thought from other parts of the world could have been better represented. Among the Europeans, there are some surprising choices. Homer and Hesiod get a chapter, as does Augustine. Their ideas seem to me less significant and relevant -- the editors' criteria for inclusion -- to issues of wealth and commerce than the ideas of Hegel and Rousseau, who are absent from the volume. Chapters on Robert Owen and G.A. Cohen might have provided a different perspective on the subject matter than most of the other authors covered in the modern era. Finally, all 20 chapters discuss the work of men, a fact that Deirdre McCloskey, in her forward to the book, laments. Women such as Mary Wollstonecraft and Martha Nussbaum have made important contributions to moral and political theory. It would be valuable to see how their ideas could be brought to bear on issues in business.

Below I will say something -- sometimes only a little something -- about each of the 20 chapters.

We begin in Ancient Greece. It is commonly believed that ancient writers held a dim view of wealth and commerce. Mark S. Peacock ("Wealth and Commerce in Archaic Greece: Homer and Hesiod") argues that this is not true in the case of Homer and Hesiod. Their view of wealth and commerce was neutral, perhaps even positive.

Unlike (if Peacock is right) Homer and Hesiod, Aristotle undeniably had a low opinion of commerce. In particular, Aristotle condemned trade for profit and lending money at interest -- two pillars of modern business. He even thought that cultivating the virtues was impossible for someone "living the life of a vulgar craftsman or a hired laborer" (p. 35). In "Aristotle and Business: Friend or Foe?", Fred Miller argues that Aristotle should not have held these beliefs, because they are inconsistent with his fundamental moral and political commitments. According to Miller, these commitments should lead Aristotle to an embrace of something more like free-market capitalism, and to an understanding of a working life as a virtuous life. In fact, despite his skepticism about commerce, Aristotle is one of the few major philosophers whose writings contemporary business ethicists have engaged with closely. In addition to Robert Solomon and Edwin Hartman, whom Miller mentions, Geoff Moore has developed a detailed account of the virtues for businesspeople and business organizations. An engagement with this literature might have produced interesting results.

The chapter on Confucius and Mencius, by David Elstein and Qing Tian ("Confucian Business Ethics: Possibilities and Challenges"), pulls a wealth of suggestive remarks out of these philosophers, without, to my mind, delivering a clear account of what they mean for business. To take one example: we are told that Confucius "spoke out against obtaining wealth by improper means" (p. 59). What means are improper, however, they do not say. To take another: Elstein and Tian say that Confucius and Mencius support harmony in firms: "the goal of a harmonious society leads to emphasis on harmonious relationships within and outside the firm" (p. 67). There is something attractive about harmonious firms -- harmony seems better morally and prudentially than discord -- but no account of harmony is provided. These ideas might be developed in future research.

In "The Earthly City and the Ethics of Exchange: Spiritual, Social, and Material Economy in Augustine's Theological Anthropology," Todd Breyfogle presents Augustine's philosophy in a sympathetic light, explaining key concepts and extending them to issues in business ethics. One idea that Breyfogle highlights concerns the use of wealth. Augustine abhors waste, and thinks wealth should be used for the public good, including the promotion of "social and spiritual solidarity" (p. 89). This idea might be deployed in debates about what firms should do with their profits. Breyfogle also emphasizes that, for Augustine, "each form of societas has an order appropriate to it." For Augustine, this means, e.g., that "the rules governing a monastic community would be inappropriate in a family" (p. 85). Contemporary business ethicists might see this as a reason to be cautious about applying principles of justice designed for states to organizations.

Martin Schlag's "Thomas Aquinas: The Economy at the Service of Justice and the Common Good" is a model of clarity and precision. He gives sharp summaries of Aquinas's justification of private property (among other reasons, it promotes the common good), evaluation of commercial activity (modest profit is permissible, as it can be understood as a wage for the trader's labor), treatment of just prices ("a sale is just when the price equals the value . . . of the thing being sold" [p. 105]), and arguments against usury (money is a medium of exchange, and should not be used to produce more money). Aquinas's own writings are difficult sometimes to the point of impenetrability. Schlag's superb presentation will help business ethicists get up to speed quickly on the key ideas and bring them into contemporary conversations.

Munir Quddus's and Salim Rashid's "The Ethics of Commerce in Islam: Ibn Khaldun's Muqaddimah Revisited," is a standout. It does exactly what the editors promised: highlight the work of a thinker no business ethicists are talking about, and show why they should be talking about him. Centuries before Smith, Ibn Khaldun argued that the "self-interested behavior . . . of traders leads generally to greater welfare . . . for society" (p. 116). A necessary condition of robust commerce, he further argued, is "justice and the rule of law," including the protection of property rights. Classical liberals will find much to admire in this -- and also in his claim that taxes should be low, for "when tax assessments and imposts upon the subjects are low, the latter have the energy and desire to do things" (p. 129). Yet they may not like his suggestion that excessive wealth should be avoided, since it leads to indolence and moral decline. There is much else in this chapter -- including a provocative discussion of the connection between Ibn Khaldun's notion of Asabiyah and Francis Fukuyama's claims about social capital -- to hold the reader's interest.

In "Hobbes's Idea of Moral Conduct in a Society of Free Individuals," Timothy Fuller considers "what light Thomas Hobbes's Leviathan . . . might shed on the issues raised in the study of business ethics today" (p. 135). Subjects covered include the moral imagination, civic virtue, and representative government. These subjects do not obviously have much to do with business ethics, though connections might be made. Patricia Werhane, for example, has written copiously on moral imagination in business ethics. Jason Brennan has argued that running a for-profit business is a form of civic virtue. Many writers have argued that firms, like states, should be governed democratically. Fuller does not make these connections, choosing instead to develop Hobbes's view in its own terms.

In "John Locke's Defense of Commercial Society: Individual Rights, Voluntary Cooperation, and Mutual Gain," Eric Mack deftly explains Locke's theory of private property acquisition, taking care to show how the introduction of money -- and the vast increase in personal wealth it makes possible -- does not violate the "enough and as good" proviso. He uncovers Locke's (possibly confused) thoughts on just prices, and explains why the impoverished have a right to work. One of the most interesting parallels Mack draws is between religious liberty and economic liberty. Indeed, he argues that Locke sees "religious freedom [as] simply a natural extension of the . . . freedoms of commercial society" (p. 173). This chapter goes well beyond the basic elements of Locke's theory familiar to political philosophers and provides much of use to business ethicists.

Gluttony is a vice. We should not eat and drink so much, or so lavishly. And yet if we did not, then there would be less work for farmers and brewers, among others. Because there would be less production, there would be less trade and less wealth. In this way, acting viciously on a personal level promotes the public good. This is the central lesson of Mandeville's Fable of the Bees, which Eugene Heath thoughtfully mines for business ethics wisdom in "As Free for Acorns as for Honesty: Mandevillean Maxims for the Ethics of Commerce." While Mandeville is more concerned to describe rather than prescribe, Heath thinks his insights are useful for moral theorizing. We are reminded, for example, that "beneficial social order may emerge in unintended ways" (p. 189) and that the rules for business activity -- or any activity -- must be sensitive to facts about human nature.

Henry C. Clark, in "'Commerce Cures Destructive Prejudices': Montesquieu and the Spirit of Commercial Society," discusses a variety of ideas in Montesquieu: his idea (shared by Mandeville) that the pursuit of luxury "leads to social and economic benefits for the patrie" (p. 209); his metaphor of the global state; and his view that "commerce has come to overtake conquest as a paradigm of the modern world" (p. 207). Clark does not claim that these ideas are important for discussions in business ethics. What Clark thinks is relevant is Montesquieu's identification of humanity and justice as the two main virtues of commercial society. This subject is treated rather quickly, however, and we are not told what the virtues of humanity and justice require in commercial settings.

We noted that ancient writers such as Aristotle were skeptical of the value of commerce. In "Hume on Commerce, Society, and Ethics," Christopher J. Berry's main goal is to trace "how Hume set about overturning the prejudice against commerce" (p. 221). This makes for interesting reading, though one wonders if Berry's attention could have been more profitably focused. It is hard to find a contemporary business ethicist of any stripe who is opposed to commerce, understood simply as 'trade'. (Plenty are opposed to free trade, but that is a different matter.) And, as Berry himself notes, Hume had views about the nature and value of property rights, patents, and price controls -- all of which are the subject of lively contemporary debates.

A book on the relevance of historically important philosophers to business ethics will of course have a chapter on Smith. All scholars are familiar with Smith's views about the benefits and costs of the division of labor, and people's motivation for exchange in a market economy. The challenge is to say something new. Douglas J. Den Uyl attempts to meet it in "The Fortune of Others: Adam Smith and the Beauty of Commerce," arguing that "commerce for Smith has more to do with beauty than utility" and that "the beauty of commerce is the basis for establishing norms of appropriateness for the governance of commerce" (p. 242). This is a provocative thesis, though it is not clear what it comes to. Suppose an employee of mine asks for a raise. He is worth the extra money, but I don't think the quality of his work will diminish if he doesn't get it. What is the beautiful choice? Den Uyl provides no way of determining that (or other practical issues). Still, this chapter provides a suggestive reading of Smith that might be developed in future research.

Some of the philosophers covered in this volume are unknown in the business ethics literature. Kant is an exception, due in large part to the work of Norman Bowie. In "Why Kant's Insistence on Purity of the Will Does Not Preclude an Application of Kant's Ethics to For-Profit Businesses," Bowie does not rehash his former achievements. His new target is the Kantian view that a person's action has moral worth only if it is done from the motive of duty. It might seem that, if this is true, then all profit-seeking activity in business -- which is most business activity -- lacks moral worth. Bowie resists this, arguing that managers of publicly traded companies have an obligation to seek profit. So, when they act in order to seek profit -- e.g., by making and selling products -- they are acting out of duty, and their actions have moral worth. According to Bowie, managers also have a duty to benefit stakeholders other than shareholders, but this duty is imperfect, and any action that managers take toward this end must be consistent with their perfect duty to seek profit. (Bowie's chapter also includes a spirited broadside against the US philosophical community for effectively abandoning business ethics as a field of study.)

Tocqueville thought that associations played a vital role in American democracy. He saw individualism as "the great moral and political threat to democratic societies" (p. 285) and associations as its remedy. For in associations, people set aside their narrow self-interest and work together to achieve a common goal. But this is true, Alan S. Kahan says, in his instructive "Tocqueville: The Corporation as an Ethical Association," not just in political and civil associations, but in productive associations as well. Kahan says it is the job of business ethicists to distinguish between good and bad productive associations, i.e., ones that benefit society and ones that do not. He applies this idea to the debate between shareholder theory and stakeholder theory, raising many familiar problems with both. A more fruitful avenue might have been to develop Tocqueville's idea that productive associations teach the "practical techniques and the psychological habits necessary to make people capable of political association" (p. 287). It is not clear that this is true, at least in all cases. Jobs that require workers simply to follow orders from others, and never to decide for themselves what to do, may undermine rather than develop the psychological habits necessary for democratic citizenship.

In "J.S. Mill and Business Ethics," Nicholas Capaldi takes the reader on a grand journey through the whole range of Mill's political, moral, and economic thought, with reference to figures as diverse as Bentham, Kant, Hegel, Comte, Ricardo, Saint-Simon, Proudhon, Hayek, Marx, and more. I found it hard to keep up. Compounding the challenge is Capaldi's distinctive reading of Mill. To take one example: Capaldi says that, for Mill, "happiness consists of dignity" (p. 305) or hedging just a bit in the next paragraph, "the chief ingredient of happiness is dignity" (p. 306). And "dignity [as Mill understands it] is synonymous with autonomy" (p. 306, emphasis in original). To be clear, Capaldi is not saying that Mill thinks that autonomy leads to happiness; he is saying that Mill thinks that happiness is autonomy. Despite this, the lessons Capaldi draws from Mill for business ethics are not, according to Capaldi himself, unique to Mill. For Capaldi believes that "all public policy disputes [can be] formulated in terms of one of two major narratives: the Lockean liberty narrative and the Rousseau/Marx narrative" (p. 306, emphasis added). Mill's thought belongs to the Lockean narrative, so its implications flow from this narrative, which privileges strong private property rights and free markets.

The next four essays -- on Marx, Hayek, Friedman, and Rawls -- are among the volume's best.

Marx might seem like an odd choice for a volume on business ethics. Business ethicists take for granted private ownership of the means of production and the use of markets to allocate resources. These are the basic building blocks of capitalism. Marx thought this whole system was both corrupt (in particular, exploitative of workers) and doomed to extinction. William H. Shaw acknowledges these points in his clear and informative "Karl Marx on History, Capitalism, and . . . Business Ethics?", but still thinks contemporary business ethicists can find something of lasting value in Marx. Marx draws attention above all to the plight of workers in capitalist economies. He invites us to see workers as unfree in a variety of ways, as subject to coercion and exploitation, and as alienated from the fruits of their labor. Shaw also thinks contemporary business ethics can learn from Marx's view about the "plight," as it were, of capitalists. Capitalists act as they do not because they are bad people, but because they are forced to do so by the economic system in which they exist.

In her thoughtful "Friedrich Hayek's Defense of the Market Order," Karen I. Vaughn focuses on the genesis and implications of Hayek's insight that the market is a "discovery procedure." By this Hayek means, roughly, that markets are a way of gathering information about what people want and what they have. No central planner, he argued, could allocate resources as efficiently as they would be allocated in a free market, i.e., through the voluntary exchanges of buyers and sellers. This insight is important for business regulators. It suggests that some regulations -- in the form of production and price controls, subsidies, and tariffs -- can impede the flow of information in society, and risk reducing overall welfare. Of course, we may decide that in some cases the benefits outweigh the costs, but Hayek gives us a way of recognizing what the costs are.

As Alexei Marcoux observes in "The Power and the Limits of Milton Friedman's Arguments Against Corporate Social Responsibility", nearly every business ethics textbook begins with a discussion of Friedman's arguments against corporate social responsibility (CSR). Yet Marcoux believes that business ethics scholars have not treated Friedman's arguments with the seriousness that they deserve. I am skeptical. A google scholar search of "Milton Friedman and CSR" yields thousands of results. But perhaps Marcoux is right, and Friedman's views are merely caricatured in these articles. In any event, Marcoux's reconstruction and critique of Friedman's position is clear, comprehensive, and probing. Friedman thinks CSR -- actions taken by firms to benefit non-shareholding stakeholders at shareholders' expense -- is problematic for a variety of reasons. First, managers have a duty to promote shareholders' interests; second, managers do not know which ends are socially valuable; third, managers aren't competent to choose efficient means to those ends; and fourth, promoting socially valuable ends is the state's job. While Marcoux hopes to jumpstart discussion of Friedman in the scholarly literature, this chapter would make an excellent supplement to Friedman's classic "The Social Responsibility of Business is to Increase Its Profits" in a business ethics class.

In addition to a discussion of Friedman's views, business ethics texts typically also include a discussion of John Rawls's two principles of justice, but as Matt Zwolinski says in his incisive "Beyond the Difference Principle: Rawlsian Justice, Business Ethics, and the Morality of the Market", it is not clear why. These principles apply to the "basic structure" of society, not the workings of associations within it. But Zwolinski says that Rawls's political thought does have implications for business, in much the same way Hayek's does: it has implications for the structure of the economy and the regulation of business activity. Rawls says that capitalist economies are unjust: he favors market socialism or property-owning democracy. Zwolinski argues that Rawls should have not said this -- that his fundamental moral and political commitments support liberal capitalist regimes. In the first place, Zwolinski says, Rawls underestimates the value of property rights to the "full and informed exercise of [the] two moral powers" (p. 389); in the second place, Rawls overestimates the productivity of market socialist or property-owning democracies, and hence their capacity to increase welfare.

The volume concludes with a discussion by Ann Cudd of the only one of its subjects who is still living: Amartya Sen. In "Commitments and Corporate Responsibility: Amartya Sen on Motivations to Do Good," Cudd's topic is the classic question of whether businesses have "social or moral responsibilities that compete with and may override the goal of wealth creation for . . . shareholders" (p. 402). Her target is Friedman's view that managers have agreed to promote shareholders' interests, and what is in shareholders' interests is maximizing their wealth. Drawing on Sen's work on the sources of human motivation, Cudd carefully shows that shareholders' interests are more varied than this, and may include, in addition to narrowly self-regarding goals, other-regarding sympathies and commitments. I think Cudd is right about this, but I am not sure that her essay makes a significant contribution to the debate about corporate governance. Common defenses of the shareholder wealth maximization norm -- by, e.g., Henry Hansmann or Stephen Bainbridge -- and criticisms of it -- by, e.g., Lynn Stout and Margaret Blair -- do not place significant weight on shareholders' interests. They speak directly to the value, or disvalue, of maximizing shareholder wealth itself.

Overall, this volume mostly succeeds in its stated goal: bringing the sometimes neglected ideas of historically important philosophers into debates in business ethics. Given its contents, it will be especially useful for scholars looking for "pro" wealth and market views in classic texts, but it is valuable for all those interested in normative issues in wealth and commerce.