Weaving the World: Simone Weil on Science, Mathematics, and Love

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Vance G. Morgan, Weaving the World: Simone Weil on Science, Mathematics, and Love, University of Notre Dame Press, 2005, 248pp, $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 0268034877

Reviewed by Mark G. Shiffman, Villanova University


In his preface to Weaving the World, Vance Morgan indicates two motives for writing this book. The first is to exhibit Simone Weil as "a shining example of how reason and faith, intellect and spirit, can and should interact in a person's search for meaning and truth" (ix). The second is "to bring to the reader's attention a largely unknown aspect of her thought, her lifelong interest in mathematics and science" (ix-x). The two aims happily coincide thanks to the overarching theme that unifies the book, the theme of mediation between mind and truth, the human and the divine. Morgan indicates the structuring role of this theme in an endnote (208, n.11), where he presents his study as the complementary converse of Springsted's Christus Mediator: whereas Springsted begins his exposition with the understanding of the cross that ultimately becomes the grounding principle of Weil's Platonic and Pythagorean thinking, Morgan follows more closely the biographical trajectory of Weil's own reflections by starting with the notion of science and working in the direction of the "geometry of the cross."

The introduction establishes that reflection on science and mathematics is not only omnipresent in Weil's thought from beginning to end, but is also bound intimately with every other topic she cares about, from social and political questions to aesthetics and theology. This is because, like art and religion, science has the order and beauty of the world as its proper object; and when it abandons the criterion of truth as its polestar (as Weil argues it has in the twentieth century), it can only devolve into a constructed instrument of utilitarian power seeking. In this case, science infuses the culture with a model of the world that supports totalitarian aspirations, and it conceives and organizes labor in such a way as to undermine the contact with reality that makes labor a soul-nourishing activity and a source of genuine community. Though the resources for a culture-renewing vision of science are available in ancient Greek thought, this renewal requires as a catalyst the revivification of the Christian tradition (10). These claims of Weil's marshaled in the first chapter sketch the program of the exposition to follow, but they also raise a host of intriguing questions about the value of Weil's thought that Morgan, because he confines his task almost entirely to explication du texte, barely ever addresses.

Chapters One and Two provide us with an account of Weil's understanding of the modern history of science. In modernity, science has become deracinated from its original grounding in common experience and has become "a universe apart, whose objects are signs" in which "the play of interchange between signs develops of itself and for itself" (16). In order to understand how this estrangement came about, Weil turns to Descartes, in whom she finds an uneasy but important coexistence of idealism and realism (and here Morgan helpfully observes that "Weil's own lifelong concern with science includes continuing attempts to conceive of a metaphysical framework that can satisfactorily accommodate a scientific vision sensitive to both of these apparently incompatible energies" [21]). Although Descartes converts traditional geometric figures into abstract and a priori relationships of pure quantity, he believes that these relations still provide the mind a means of apprehending the reality of body with which physics is concerned. The crucial link is the imagination; for Descartes, the study of geometry is still sufficiently grounded in figures that the clarification of the quantitative relationships serves to render our imaginations more exact.

In her rethinking of the project of Cartesian doubt, Weil focuses on the fact that thinking is an activity of which the I is ambiguously the subject; hence, "an investigation of the limits of my control over my thoughts and actions will at the same time be an investigation of the boundary between, or intersection of, myself and the world" (25). As Morgan observes, this "philosophical commitment to the connection between thinker and world" remains a distinctive feature of Weil's thought to the end. Further, her study of Descartes already reveals one of the most characteristic features of her analysis of this connection. She observes that our sovereignty over the activity of our minds remains complete so long as we simply doubt; as soon as we endeavor to think about something, we discover limits. She remarks: "Since no power is limited by itself, it is enough for me to know that my power is not absolute to know that my existence is not the only existence" (25). Here we have the germ of the profound and far-reaching investigations of the tensions between the empire of the self and receptivity to the other that lie at the core of Weil's ethics, psychology and theology, an investigation that focuses precisely on the imagination's mediating role between self, world and the transcendent, and hence leads to her aesthetic concerns about the way literature can serve as a revelation of the real.

Just as she elevates to consciousness the neglected realism in Descartes' thought, Weil also throws a revealing light on Descartes' appeal to the workman's practical understanding of geometrical truths. For it is above all in physical labor that she sees the possibility for adjusting the mind's conceptual analysis of bodily relationships to bodily reality, and so rectifying imagination. As bodily creatures engaging with problems in the world, such as boulders that we wish to move, we discover that the motions of our own bodies and other bodies obey geometrical necessities. Hence, within the turn to practicality of classical modern science and its mechanistic tendencies, Weil sees not only the will to mastery and reductionism, but also a phenomenological connection to the intuitions of labor. Thus the key concept of classical physics, "energy", is "a concept derived directly from the concept of work" (39), and is always translatable into the displacement of a body in space and vice versa. Relative to this phenomenological base, the language of algebra serves the role of handmaiden, providing a convenient language for expressing relations succinctly. As we see in Chapter Three, with quantum theory all of this changes. Planck, by representing energy as something discontinuous, severed its conceptual connection to the labor of moving a body through space, which is continuous, and supplied no new conception in its place, leaving it an unintelligible variable in a self-referential system of signification. Einstein exploited algebra's capacity to express relationships between finite and infinite velocities that only make sense within a system of symbols and bear no analogue in human experience, and thus further separated physics from intuition. The consequence: "When the results of contemporary scientific research can no longer be pictured or imagined in any meaningful way, the only justification for science becomes its technical applications" (60).

I have dwelt at length on Morgan's exposition of Weil's grappling with Descartes (his second chapter) because I think it offers indications of one fruitful direction we might take Weil's analysis of science. One might overlook as inessential Morgan's failure to mention the influence of Marx on Weil's thought here, especially as that influence will be apparent to most readers. What should not go without comment, however, are the profound similarities and even more important differences between Weil's reflections and Husserl's Cartesian Meditations and Crisis of the European Sciences. Both Weil and Husserl are rethinking and revising Descartes' philosophical project and seeking the constant within the flux of our representations, but in very different ways. Both are concerned with the loss of meaning in modern science and see the roots of this development in the role of algebra, but they bring to light different aspects of this story. Weil seems to be working in the direction of a phenomenology, but one that does justice to the mind's experience of otherness rather than methodologically bracketing being. There seem to be grounds to suspect that a rethinking of Weil and Husserl side by side could have the advantages of bringing Weil's thoughts on science into more direct conversation with the phenomenological tradition, rendering them more compelling while also offering remedies to the hermetic "egology" of Husserl's method so devastatingly criticized by Heidegger and Levinas. This project seems all the more promising in that Weil, in proposing the geometry of the Greeks as a remedy to the inhuman technicity of modern science, runs counter to Heidegger's narrative of the continuity of western metaphysics -- a point on which she sounds like Husserl's disciple Jacob Klein and Klein's disciple David Lachterman.

Rather than engage this continental tradition of thought, when Morgan turns in Chapter Three to confront possible objections to Weil's Pythagorean revival, he takes as his interlocutor the Wittgensteinian Rush Rhees. Rhees admires Weil's mind, but cannot understand her habit of writing as if the same language can be meaningful in diverse disciplines, especially in both scientific and religious discourse. Morgan rightly responds that Rhees attempts to interpret Weil across the gulf of divergent fundamental assumptions without being willing to submit his own to interrogation. But this leaves Morgan with the problem of explaining how to decide between two different metaphysical frameworks. His expedient is to offer Weil's "worldview" as a response to the crisis of science, understood primarily in terms of its disconnection from our "need for value and meaning" (88). Weil's understanding of science enables us to reconnect the "is" and the "ought" that modern thought severs (37, 88). But how can Morgan, or Weil for that matter, escape the suspicion that we are thereby deriving the "is" from the "ought" rather than vice versa? His best attempt is to argue that Weil's vision is grounded in a theology that Rhees' can't rule out. It seems to me, however, that we need not jump so quickly to theology to defend Weil. Thus in indicating the intersections of Weil and phenomenology I am not simply indulging in a sketch of the book I wish Morgan had written. Hussserl and followers (and critics) enable us to understand Weil's analyses as a response to a crisis above all of truth, a crisis to be overcome in terms of the internal logic of the demands of attention, a central notion of Weil's that unifies her thought and receives insufficient emphasis in Weaving the World. Also relevant for responding to Rhees would be Weil's own reflections (in "Human Personality") on the need for language that precisely resists exact conceptualization and so opens our attention to dialogue with others and to the revelation of the transcendent (a point on which Weil's Platonism comes close to Gadamer's).

This recognizably philosophical and, as it were, "pre-theological" ground of engagement would help smooth the somewhat jarring impression of Morgan's turn from modern to ancient science and thence to theology, and reduce the risk of the impression (which Weil would certainly reject) that what is being offered is merely an alternative and more attractive vision rather than a path to truth that should be recognizable as such to a receptive mind. This criticism, however, pertains mainly to the challenge of philosophical apologetics and the aspiration to give Weil's insights on these topics a more rigorous philosophical lucidity than her articulations usually provide. Morgan's exegesis is certainly faithful to Weil's formulation that for the Greeks science provided bridges to the divine, whereas we have decided that these structures are useful as foundations for skyscrapers (91).

It is this function of bridging the immense distance between human misery and divine perfection, which Weil sees as the secret of all Greek culture, that she crystallizes in her adoption of the Greek word metaxu, the intermediary. Morgan ably shows in Chapter Three how this notion lies at the heart of the central concepts of Pythagoreanism, especially the concepts of number, limit, and the indeterminate, and above all the harmony revealed in the whole-number ratios that determine the familiar tonal intervals of the musical scale. The Pythagoreans are said to have found in all this evidence of a mysterious gift of intelligibility whose source is other than human. As Chapter Four explains, Weil contends that this intuition of mathematics as revelation of the divine is the only motive adequate to explain the devotion of attention that discovered the rigorous demonstrations of geometry (101). Morgan goes on to explain quite lucidly some of the key Pythagorean discoveries about triangles and proportionals, and especially Weil's view that the discovery of irrationals precipitated a scandal that imparted intense energy to the Greek development of geometry as it sought to "search for a mediation of these wretched numbers" (120). Given that the solution of Eudoxus involved contemplating contradictions until there was revealed to the mind a higher level of rationality beyond what can be numerically represented, it may be that Weil believes this crisis gave rise to Platonic metaphysics itself, which she understands as functioning this way. Not only that, but the discovery foreshadowed the continuity of Platonism and Christianity: "This notion forces the mind to deal in exact terms with those relationships which it is incapable of representing to itself. Here is an admirable introduction to the mysteries of faith" (126).

Accordingly, Chapters Five and Six explain how Pythagorean concepts of mediation and harmony serve, according to Weil, as preparatory signs, indeed prophecies, of Christ's mediation between man, God, and creation. Particularly interesting from the point of view of faith and reason is Weil's idea that, given the kenotic nature of the act of creation and the Pythagorean analysis of mediation, the Incarnation and Passion are virtually deducible as events destined to provide "harmony between incommensurable quantities that, in themselves, still remain incommensurable" (153). In these chapters Morgan touches on more fundamental aspects of Weil's thought than can be done justice here. The concluding chapter issues a rallying call for a science based on love and beauty rather than on technical domination, and seems to land us back in a position potentially vulnerable to a hermeneutic of suspicion as outlined above.

The criticisms here offered of the apologetic dimension of Morgan's undertaking should not distract us from the virtues of the book as exegesis, which are admirable. Morgan convincingly demonstrates the connection of Weil's ruminations on science with every aspect of her thought, masterfully weaves together passages from essays, letters, journals, and lecture notes from every period of her life, and provides succinct explanations of every mathematical and scientific idea relevant to his exposition. The book is well written, sensibly organized, and very rich in content. Although the study of Simone Weil is still in its youth as a field of philosophy, books like Morgan's and the collection The Christian Platonism of Simone Weil (reviewed in NDPR 2005.07.14) demonstrate that it is well out of its infancy.