Weighing and Reasoning: Themes from the Philosophy of John Broome

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Iwao Hirose and Andrew Reisner (eds.), Weighing and Reasoning: Themes from the Philosophy of John Broome, Oxford University Press, 2015, 255pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199684908.

Reviewed by Barry Maguire, University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


This volume honouring John Broome on his retirement from Oxford consists mainly of papers on two themes, written by an illustrious group of friends and former students. One theme is the relationship between individual good and overall good. The other theme is Broome's work on reasons, explanation, and ought. Among outliers, one chapter by renowned economist and philosopher Geoffrey Brennan makes an important point about interdisciplinary methodology. The contributions are rather varied in length and quality. Theorists with a serious interest in one or other of these themes would benefit from closely studying many of them.

In the opening chapter, Brennan urges ethical theorists to make more use of economistic concepts. He helpfully distinguishes the notion of a trade-off, or marginal adjustment, from a mere choice. In a trade-off, some quantity of one valuable thing is traded for a greater quantity of some other valuable thing. The larger the pour, the stronger the headache. This is distinguished from a simple choice between two goods, one slightly more valuable than the other -- Lagavulin or Famous Grouse. This distinction troubles certain theories that distinguish options prior to evaluating them. The bulk of Brennan's paper argues that economics itself would benefit from employing this comparative ideology in the context of certain well-known impossibility theorems, thereby reducing them to optimization problems. In the case of Arrow's theorem, his suggestion relies on the possibility of finding suitable comparative properties to replace various properties usually rendered categorically: Pareto optimality, independence, non-dictatorship, etc. Brennan goes some way to showing that this can be achieved.

I'll use this short review to bring several of the contributions into one discussion. I'll focus on three chapters addressing Broome's account of reasons, explanation, weight, and weighing. Together they improve our understanding of the limits and prospects for Broome's deflationary approach.

Broome argues that for some fact to be a normative reason for you to do something is for that fact to stand in some particular explanatory relation to an ought fact.[1] The idea that a fact is a normative reason in virtue of explaining an ought fact inverts the natural thought that a fact explains an ought fact in virtue of being a normative reason. In effect, Broome maintains that normative reasons are simply explanatory reasons, distinguished by what they explain -- and, for some reasons, also by their particular explanatory role. The simplest such account maintains that for a fact to be a pro toto reason is for it to be an explanation of an ought fact or, as Broome elaborates, "something that makes it the case that you ought to F." A compelling objection to the theoretical fruitfulness of this simple account cumulates across several independent chapters.

Jonathan Dancy (187), Roger Crisp (144), and Stephen Kearns and Daniel Star (234) separately point out that the following is an exemplary explanation of an ought fact: "The combined weights of the reasons for you to F exceed the combined weights of the reasons for you not to F" (Kearns and Star, 234). But this is not a reason to F. It is an overall normative fact. It obtains in virtue of all the reasons to F. There is no additional reason. Intuitively, the reasons are parts of the explanation of this fact. This is an instance of a general challenge. Broome needs to say enough about 'explanation' to give his account substantive content while continuing to draw the right distinctions. This constructive work remains to be done.

Broome's more promising proposal is that for a fact to be a pro tanto reason is for it to play a particular role in a weighing explanation of an ought fact. Again this analysis inverts the usual order of explanation, according to which a fact plays that role in virtue of being a normative reason.

The central challenge for Broome is to characterize a weighing explanation, and the specific role in question, without appealing to the distinctive ideology of normative reasons or their weight. Broome offers the following[2]:

In a weighing explanation of why you ought to F, the for-F role is the winning one, and that is how it can be identified. Similarly, in a weighing explanation of why you ought not to F, the for-F role is the losing one. In either case, we can identify this role without calling on any prior understanding of counting in favour.

One issue raised by Kearns and Star (236) is that some considerations that play a role in a weighing explanation are conditions rather than reasons. This puts pressure on Broome to distinguish the role that reasons play in a weighing explanation without relying on the ideology of normative reasons. (Kearns and Star confess that their own 'reasons as evidence' thesis cannot easily draw this distinction either.) A familiar, though currently underdeveloped, reply is that the reason/condition distinction is shifty, just like the cause/condition distinction.

A second issue raised by Dancy (182) is that the distinction between a reason against F and a reason for not-F cannot be easily captured with Broome's ideology of 'winning' or 'losing.' Brennan's distinction is helpful in drawing out Dancy's point. Instead of considering the choice between F and alternatives, consider possible trade-offs between more and less F-ish options. A reason against F will also be a reason against F-ish alternatives and hence won't be a reason for every alternative to F. A reason against Lagavulin (that you'll end up with a headache) might not be a reason for Famous Grouse. Again there is some work to be done here.

A related issue raised by Crisp concerns the need for an account of ultimate reason-giving properties. Crisp argues that Broome might not be able to draw this distinction with his meagre ideological resources (144):

Mr Reed's being skilled at dentistry, [Broome] claims, is an explanation of why you ought to visit him, and hence a reason for doing so. But the ultimate reason-giving property of the action of visiting Mr Reed is the same as eating the apricot in the fruit-bowl case: that it will make your life better for you, that is, advance your well-being. Mr Reed's being skilled at dentistry helps to explain why it is that you ought to visit him; but you have no ultimate reason to visit someone skilled at dentistry.

One way to deal with all of these issues is to appeal to some underlying property that correlates with being a reason for or a reason against, such as value. Reasons would then be facts about different values promoted by actions and which explain ought facts. This proposal would enable Broome to distinguish reasons against F from reasons for not-F. Reasons against F are facts about options promoting disvalue. Reasons for not-F are explained in terms of reasons against F and facts about which options are alternatives to F. The ultimate/non-ultimate distinction would be accounted for more straightforwardly, along the lines Crisp sketches. This is still an analysis of normative reasons in terms of explanation. But since facts about value are among the analysans, this wouldn't be an account according to which ought facts are explanatorily prior to all other normative facts.[3]

At the core of their chapter, and in one of the most interesting discussions in the book, Kearns and Star present an original objection to the very idea of a weighing explanation. This challenge puts more pressure on Broome to offer a more constructive account of weighing explanations. They begin by characterizing a variety of explanations of non-normative facts in some detail. They point out a variety of similarities between (inter alia) the following two cases, the former being one of Broome's models of a weighing explanation:

travel: Suppose you are choosing between Montreux and Marrakesh as places to visit. Suppose that you ought to choose Montreux, on the grounds that it is a pleasant resort and not so far away as Marrakesh, though less exotic. The explanation of why you ought to visit Montreux is a weighing one. In favour of visiting Montreux are its pleasantness and proximity. Each plays the for-Montreux role in the explanation. They are pro tanto reasons for you to visit Montreux. Against visiting Montreux is the exoticness of the alternative, Marrakesh. That plays the against-Montreux role. It is a pro tanto reason for you not to visit Montreux. The reasons for visiting Montreux outweigh the one for not doing so.

sprint: Someone loses a 100 m sprint Olympic final. She loses because she faces a tough opponent (who wins) and is not very good at handling extreme stress. She had a good chance of winning, however, because she is capable of running faster than her opponent, she prepared well for the race, and she was more motivated to win than anyone.

These explanations share various key features of weighing explanations. For instance, both involve various considerations that play 'for-F' and 'against-F' roles. But in the case of sprint:

though the facts in our explanations often involve quantities of certain types -- quantities, furthermore, that play crucial roles in these explanations (as described in the previous section) -- the facts involved do not have anything readily identifiable as weights. (246)

Kearns and Star argue from the similarity between travel and sprint in other respects to the conclusion that there are no facts with anything readily identifiable as weights in travel either. Their discussion is sophisticated, but the nature of the reply available to Broome is fairly simple, namely to deny that there is sufficient similarity between the two cases.

To see this, consider a third case which, like travel but unlike sprintdoes involve something identifiable as a weight:

prize: Someone wins the class prize. She wins because she has the highest score out of the 30 students. It is a multiple-choice quiz, answered by choosing A-D for each question. The score is worked out from the number of points assigned to answers of varying difficulty, minus some points deducted for egregiously wrong answers.

I suggest that this case is relevantly similar to travel and relevantly dissimilar to sprint. What's more we can distinguish these classes of explanations, consistent with Broome's ideology, by appealing to a general distinction between quantitative and qualitative explanations. Quantitative explanations appeal more abstractly to quantitative features of their explanans. To give another example: an explanation of which stew used the largest number of ingredients would be quantitative. The fact that one stew had carrots rather than turnips, and the other rabbit rather than goat, isn't relevant to this question. All that matters is how many different ingredients there were in each. Contrast this with an explanation of the taste of either stew in terms of the nature of its ingredients and the cooking method. Similarly, for the purposes of explaining why one student won the prize rather than another, it is not necessary to mention the facts the various students knew. It only matters which answers they picked and what weights those answers were assigned.

So there is an available distinction between sprint (and Kearns and Star's other examples) on the one hand, and travel and prize on the other. In the case of both travel and prize the explanandum is explained quantitatively -- in terms of some abstracted quantitative feature of the explanans. There is, in both cases, something identifiable as having weight playing the for-F and against-F roles. In prize, this is the student's score for any individual answer. In travel, we are tempted to say, it is the value of the pleasantness, exoticness, and inconvenience. (Broome has a bit more work to do here too.) By pointing at these two examples we can define a weighing explanation ostensively as a subspecies of quantitative explanation. Perhaps Broome himself wouldn't draw this particular distinction; he tends to prefer a more pragmatic approach to explanation. The central point of this reply to Kearns and Star is that a variety of structural distinctions can consistently be brought to the defence of a deflationary theory of reasons.

John Broome's core deflationary thesis looks even more attractive after subjection to forceful criticism. This is a fitting tribute.

[1 An ought fact is any fact of the form [A ought to x], where A is any agent, x is an option, and 'ought' picks out some member of a class of strict normative properties.

[2] Rationality Through Reasoning, 64.

[3] In 'The Value-Based Theory of Reasons' (ms) I offer more detail. I also argue that the Kearns and Star 'Reasons as Evidence' thesis is consistent with an ought-based or value-based account of reasons.