Weighing Lives

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John Broome, Weighing Lives, Oxford University Press, 2004, 288pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 019924376X.

Reviewed by Garrett Cullity, University of Adelaide


This is a successor and close companion to Weighing Goods (1991): it is another splendid book. Broome's aim in the two books is spell out how people's states of well-being (that is, how well off they are) should be aggregated in order to determine the value of an overall distribution of well-being. He sees this as part of the larger task of specifying "the formal structure of good". The aim is not to settle which things are part of our well-being, but to spell out the principles on which those things (whatever they are) contribute to the overall goodness of a state of affairs.

Broome does not claim that well-being is the sole determinant of the goodness of states of affairs, nor that the goodness of states of affairs is the sole determinant of what we ought to do. His discussion therefore ought to interest moral philosophers of all theoretical persuasions, as well as welfare economists. On any plausible moral theory, our decisions can have good or bad effects on people's well-being, and how good or bad those effects are bears on what we ought to do. An important practical question, therefore, is whether we can devise a theory adequate to guiding large-scale decision-making that has such effects.

In Weighing Goods, Broome argued for "the interpersonal addition theorem" according to which, for a single group of people, one distribution of well-being is better than another if and only if the weighted total of the well-beings of its members is greater. The new book extends this in two different directions. Working outwards, it compares the values of distributions of well-being for different groups of the same size and then groups of different sizes. And working inwards, it asks how the states of well-being of a single person at different times (states of "temporal well-being") should be aggregated to determine her overall, "lifetime" level of well-being.

Weighing Lives reaches the following conclusion. Consider the level of temporal well-being for which it would be neither better nor worse for you to continue to live at that level. Treat this as a level of zero well-being, and a life lived constantly at that level as having zero lifetime well-being. Then the first part of Broome's conclusion is that your lifetime well-being is the sum of the values of all of your states of temporal well-being. Next, consider the level of lifetime well-being for which it would be neither better nor worse to add a person at that level to a population. Call this "the neutral level for adding a life". The second part of Broome's conclusion is that the value of a distribution of well-being for any population is the sum of the amounts by which the lifetime well-being of each person exceeds the neutral level for adding a life. (For someone below the neutral level, this amount is negative.) Broome labels this conclusion "the integrated standardized total principle".

The structure of the book is dictated by what is needed to defend this conclusion. It requires that well-being can be measured cardinally: the first six chapters defend this claim. It requires showing that the overall value of a distribution is determined by the lifetime well-beings of the individuals it contains: this is defended in Chapters 7 and 8. It requires extending the interpersonal addition theorem to cover different groups of the same size, and groups of different sizes: Chapters 9 and 14 do so, respectively. It requires that there is a neutral level for adding a life, and that it is the same in all contexts: this is argued in Chapters 10-13. And it requires a defence of the corresponding claims about the aggregation of states of temporal well-being to determine lifetime well-being: this is covered briskly, with a series of corresponding arguments, in Chapters 15-17.

For those familiar with Parfit's Reasons and Persons, the best way to summarize what is striking about Broome's view is that it entails a version of Parfit's "repugnant conclusion". As Parfit explains it, if it is best to have the highest total of well-being then, given a population of any size in which everyone enjoys an extremely high level of well-being, it will be better to have a much larger population of people all of whose lives are barely worth living. With an important qualification, Broome bites this bullet. The notion of "a life barely worth living" spans two ideas which he separates. There is the level of well-being such that a life is only just worth continuing at that level (slightly above zero), and the level of well-being such that adding a further life at that level would be only slightly better than not doing so (slightly above the neutral level for adding a life). If it would be better not to add a life which, once it existed, would be only just worth continuing, then these two levels are different. And if the neutral level for adding a life is substantially higher than zero, then that blunts the repugnant conclusion. Perhaps a life needs to be highly satisfactory before adding it is better than not doing so.

One of the engaging and valuable features of Broome's book is its honesty in highlighting the difficulties for his own view. The problem just mentioned gets more serious when combined with two others. One is the "negative repugnant conclusion". For any number of people who are suffering atrociously, it will be worse to have some larger number of people living only slightly below the neutral level for adding a life. Second, the higher the neutral level, the less plausible this will be. This pair of problems could be mitigated by conceiving of the neutral level as covering a wide range of different well-beings. This idea is intuitively attractive: although there are some levels of well-being so low that it would be bad to bring people into existence at those levels, and perhaps some so high that it would be bad not to, there seems to be a wide range in between for which we cannot say either of these things. However, the central problem discussed by the book is the difficulty accommodating this idea.

Broome canvasses three ways of trying to account for a broad neutral range. One is to say that distributions that differ only in adding a person within this range are equally good. He dismisses this on the strength of the following type of example. Suppose the neutral range contains highly satisfactory lives (thus blunting the repugnant conclusion) and lives of very low quality (thus blunting the negative repugnant conclusion). We might represent this cardinally as a range from 10 units of well-being down to 0. Then consider the following alternative distributions (where each place in the set of numbers represents a person, the number indicates that person's level of well-being, and "-" indicates that the person does not live in that distribution):

A = (10, 10, 10, -)

B = (10, 10, 10, 10)

C = (10, 10, 10, 1)

B adds to A someone at the top of the neutral range, so (on this first account) B and A are equally good. C adds to A someone at the bottom of the neutral range, so C and A are also equally good. But B is better than C: this follows from the interpersonal addition theorem. The transitivity of "equally good" then generates a contradiction.

The other two possibilities are to treat the neutral range as a range of incommensurateness or a range of vagueness. These accounts avoid the objection just described, because they deny that distributions that differ only in adding a person within the neutral range are equally good. An incommensurateness account adds that those distributions are not better and not worse than each other. On a vagueness account, by contrast, we can neither assert nor deny that either is better or worse.

Broome argues that vagueness is incompatible with incommensurateness, and that since the neutral level is surely vague, neutrality cannot be interpreted as incommensurateness. (This argument would deserve discussion in a longer review.) However, he thinks that neither will plausibly allow him to account for a broad neutral range for adding a life. On either account, Broome's conclusion (the integrated standardized total principle) would need to be applied to each of the levels of well-being within the neutral range. If one distribution is better than another for all levels within that range, it is better; if it is worse for all levels, it is worse; and if neither of those things is true, it is neither better nor worse. The problem is that this generates the third of these conclusions too often. Broome calls this the problem of "greedy neutrality".

For an illustration of this problem, consider the choice between:

D = (10, 10, 5, 5)

E = (10, 10, 1, -)

with the neutral range from 10 to 0 as before. Clearly, E is worse than D. It is worse for the worse off, better for no one, and both the total and average levels of well-being are lower. However, Broome's integrated standardized total principle tells us that E is worse than D when the neutral level is set at the bottom of the range but better when it is set at the top, so neither distribution is better than the other.

The wider the neutral range, the more implausible this result is. However, as Broome readily acknowledges, as long as there is any range of different levels of well-being for which adding a person to a population is neither better nor worse, his view will carry counterintuitive implications. No matter how narrow the range, we can produce an example of the form just given, by preserving the appropriate proportions.

Broome concludes that the right view will be the least implausible compromise between recognizing a zone of vagueness surrounding the neutral level which is broad enough to blunt the positive and negative repugnant conclusions, but not so broad that it leads to intolerable forms of greedy neutrality. He accepts that any such compromise is bound to be to some degree counterintuitive.

The alternative is to question the argument that has led him to this conclusion. For some philosophers, the mistake is to have set out to cardinalize well-being at all. However, that is a drastic response. The questions of large-scale policy that this work is intended to address are very real; they need theoretical guidance; and it is hard to see how that can be done without treating well-being cardinally.

Beyond this, there are three main alternatives. We could deny the transitivity of "better than". We could go back to Weighing Goods and fault the argument for the interpersonal addition theorem. Or we could challenge the inferences Broome makes from there.

Broome argues succinctly but convincingly that transitivity is part of the logic of comparatives and hence of "better than". We might then wonder whether the problem has its seeds in the interpersonal addition theorem. There is after all much to take issue with there. There are questions about the extent to which values of equality and fairness can be appropriately accommodated by it; and questions about whether it says the right thing about bad forms of well-being (those deriving from malice or envy, for example).

However, this is the wrong place to look for the source of the problem concerning greedy neutrality. To see why, consider the choice between:

F = (10, 1, -)

G = (1, -, 10)

Someone who thinks there is a neutral range for adding a life, extending from 10 to 0, should reason as follows. There is one person who will live in both distributions. G would be worse than F for that person, so it is in that way worse. There are two other differences between F and G. F adds to G a life in the neutral range. G adds to F a life in the neutral range. In these two respects, neither distribution is better than the other. So overall, G is worse than F, since it is worse in one way and neutral in two others. However, this immediately causes a problem. Add a third option:

H = (-,10, 1)

By parity of reasoning, we would have to say that H is better than F, and G is better than H, which violates transitivity.

Therefore, it seems that as soon as we posit a range within which reducing a given person's well-being is bad, but adding or removing a life lived within that range is neither good nor bad, problems of the kind Broome raises will arise. Those problems seem independent of whether our principle for evaluating distributions of well-being favours those with the highest total -- as Broome maintains -- or not.

Broome says less about the aggregation of well-being within a life, and is less committed to the truth of what he does say. He offers us a "default theory", structured along parallel lines to his treatment of interpersonal aggregation. He indicates various points at which divergent views might give rise to revisions and additions. However, there are deeper worries to raise about this part of the project: worries about whether lifetime well-being is aggregated out of states of temporal well-being at all.

We should agree that there are states of temporal well-being. I can be better or worse off at different times: my life might be going better now than it was at this time last year, say. But doubts can be raised about whether lifetime well-being -- how well my life goes as a whole -- is aggregated out of such states. It appears, for example, that a life may be better because it overcomes great hardship. Nelson Mandela's temporal well-being on Robben Island was low, but his life as a whole has been better -- and better for him -- because of the way it has triumphed over adversity. His lifetime well-being is higher than it would have been without the inclusion of periods of low temporal well-being.

Broome makes a point which might be applied to this example. When an extended course of activity aims at completing a project, its eventual completion may mean that the whole activity was good for me at each time I was engaged in it. Broome calls this "backwards causation" of well-being. He might then say that, to the extent that Mandela's life was better because it triumphed over adversity, his adversity was not really adversity: at least, not for him -- being sent to prison actually, despite appearances, made him better off at that time. That seems hard to accept. But it leads to a more fundamental worry. It now looks as though, far from aggregating lifetime well-being out of states of temporal well-being, we are distributing our overall assessment of lifetime well-being into states of temporal well-being. Lifetime well-being is determining temporal well-being, rather than vice versa.

For these reasons, I am more dubious about Broome's treatment of intrapersonal aggregation than about his treatment of interpersonal aggregation. But so is he. And even if you are unconvinced that lifetime well-being is aggregated from temporal well-being, you still need to engage with Broome's benchmark discussion of interpersonal aggregation. He has given us an engrossing book which is a model of clarity, elegance, and rigour. Written, as good philosophy should be, as a contribution to a joint enterprise, it sets out a bold position in a way that invites further discussion and provides a platform for the development of diverging views. It should serve as the reference-point for future theorizing about population ethics in particular, and the aggregation of well-being more generally.