Weighing Reasons

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Errol Lord and Barry Maguire (eds.), Weighing Reasons, Oxford University Press, 2016, 301pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199315192.

Reviewed by Jussi Suikkanen, University of Birmingham


It has become increasingly evident that there are two kinds of normative concepts. Some refer to strict categories: actions are required, merely permissible, or forbidden; we ought to do some actions and ought not to do others; actions are right or wrong; and so on. These concepts are used to make deontic evaluations on the overall, all-things-considered level. Other normative concepts refer to properties that come in degrees: actions and outcomes can be more or less good or bad, we can have stronger and weaker reasons for and against different actions and attitudes, and so on. These evaluations are on the contributory level and the properties referred to in them at least in part explain the overall deontic status of actions.

Reliance on this framework is common today in moral philosophy and there are several good reasons to accept it, but there has been relatively little explicit theorizing about how we should understand the contributory level normative properties that come in degrees. Put in the currently popular jargon of reasons, what is it for reasons to have more or less weight? How do the weights of different reasons combine in different contexts to determine what we ought to do overall? How can the weights of different reasons be influenced by different considerations in each context?

Weighing Reasons is a refreshing collection about these and related questions. All too often volumes of this type contain very little new work and so are sometimes a little bit stale. They tend to be on already much-debated topics and their famous contributors rarely venture outside their well-known views. This anthology, in contrast, is on a relatively unexplored topic, and its editors and many of its authors belong to a stellar younger generation of philosophers. The book therefore promises a lot. The question is: does it deliver?

In my mind, the articles fall into three categories. The first six articles are all exciting and in many ways ground breaking. They tend to attempt to tackle bravely the previous core questions about the weights of reasons -- both head on and in original ways. They have also been written by younger philosophers who are not relying on their previously published work but rather exploring new lines of thought. In contrast, chapters 7-10 are from authors who have already made significant contributions to the philosophical reflection about reasons. These essays are slightly less valuable because it is less clear just how much they add to the authors' already well-known publications on the topic. Finally, the last four essays are very interesting and in many ways excellent but unfortunately their main topics fall outside the main questions about the weights of reasons. Because of this, I will focus on the first six articles.

The collection begins with Errol Lord and Barry Maguire's "An Opinionated Guide to the Weight of Reasons". This helpful overview begins by drawing various distinctions between different types of normative notions in order to motivate the previous idea that we need weighted notions such as reasons in normative theorizing. These distinctions also clarify the central questions about the weights of reasons. Lord and Maguire then outline how philosophers have used contributing reasons and their weights to explain deontic facts such as what we ought to do and what we are permitted to do. This has required (i) drawing distinctions between sufficient and decisive reasons in terms of the weights of reasons, (ii) observing how reasons can be switched on and off by disabling and enabling conditions and how they can have their strengths modified by intensifiers and attenuators, and (iii) considering how different reasons can add up and combine in other more sophisticated ways.

In the last part of their overview, Lord and Maguire consider three possible ways of thinking about the weights of reasons. We can (i) take the weights of reasons as basic and use them to explain which reasons are weightier than others, (ii) take the relation of being weightier than as basic and use it to explain the weights of reasons, or (iii) take weights and weightier than relations to be independent of one another and understand both in terms of some other more basic notion. I found this part especially valuable. It located different views about reasons in the logical space in an illuminating way, and it also outlined what the costs and benefits of previous three alternatives are in terms of how well they can account for the structure of the normative reality. I hope that this map will be used in future debates about reasons.

Ralf Bader's excellent "Conditions, Modifiers and Holism" is perhaps the most rigorous contribution. Bader starts from the idea that, even if it is well known that reasons function in sophisticated context-sensitive ways, these ways have been badly understood due to philosophers relying too much on intuitions about individual cases. He suggests that we should instead begin from metaphysics. The idea is to start from sources of reasons: these are the considerations that constitute reasons. What these sources are in different circumstances is then determined by grounding principles of the form "T grounds R on condition that C". Such principles make it the case that various considerations are sources of reasons when the conditions specified in the principle obtain. These principles therefore enable us to capture the enabling and disabling conditions of reasons: the obtaining of the latter conditions fixes whether the grounds specified in the grounding principle constitute reasons in the relevant situations. The grounding principles also help us to understand the difference between the previous conditions and the considerations that modify the strength of reasons. Whereas the previous conditions specify whether a reason relation obtains in the first place, the intensifiers and attenuators only affect the strength of the relation when it remains in place according to the grounding principle in question.

The value of Bader's framework stems from  how nicely it helps us to answer various otherwise puzzling questions about reasons. It enables us to see just why presences of enablers are not absences of disablers. This is because enablers make grounding relations possible whereas absences of disablers are merely counterfactually relevant for what reasons there are. We also learn that grounding principles themselves are not enablers, that enablers do not have enablers themselves, that modifiers are not parts of reasons, that modifiers can be used to draw the distinction between agent-relative and agent-neutral reasons, that full explanations of reasons are not identical with what the reasons are, and that we can have local additivity of reasons even if reasons are conditional. Bader's framework thus has many important theoretical advantages and it definitely provides a clear and more precise way of understanding the structure of reasons. The framework is, however, very dependent on the normative grounding principles and ,unfortunately, not much is said about their status here.

Shyam Nair's "How do reasons accrue?" defends in an original way a simple view of how reasons combine together. The basic proposal is that we should merely add the strengths of reasons up in any given situation. This basic principle seems to fail often. In Nair's example, even if heat and rain are individually strong reasons not to go for a run, when present together these reasons do not add up to a stronger reason. If it is both hot and raining, together these are only a weak reason not to go for a run. His solution to this puzzle is to draw a distinction between basic and derivative reasons where derivative reasons inherit their normative oomph from the basic ones. The suggestion then is that we are always allowed to add up basic reasons but not derivative ones. This explains why the previous reasons do not add up: they are both reasons derived from the more basic reasons we have for going for an enjoyable run. Nair finally argues that, even if his proposal faces objections, these objections are answerable and the proposal also enjoys important advantages over taking the independence of the reasons that do add up to be a brute fact.

If true, Nair's view entails that there cannot be two basic, non-derivative reasons that do not simply add up. Basic reasons could never either disable each other or intensify or attenuate each other. One problem with Nair's article is that we have not been given an argument for why such cases could not exist. Before such an argument is provided, we do not have much more than a promising hypothesis. The existence of the possible counter-examples, of course, much depends on our substantial views about which reasons are basic and how imaginative we are.

Daniel Fogal's "Reasons, Reason, and Context" is perhaps the boldest article in the collection. Fogal argues against the dogma according to which the many reasons we have are basic and should be used to explain what we have reason to do. He motivates the opposite view first with a simple observation about language. The claim is that the reason/reasons mass noun-count noun pair functions much like the corresponding pleasure/pleasures pair. In the latter case, we are allowed to move from "eating ice-cream is a pleasure" to "eating ice-cream gives me pleasure". Here in the first sentence the count noun "a pleasure" is used to describe an activity and in the second that activity is described as producing the "stuff" denoted by the mass noun (pleasure). More importantly, in this example, we need to rely on pleasure to understand particular pleasures, whereas we cannot understand what pleasure is by beginning from pleasures. Fogal's argument then is that, in the case of reasons, similar transitions are permissible: we can move from "that it's refreshing is a reason to eat ice cream" to "that it is refreshing gives us reason to eat ice cream". For the sake of consistency, here too we should think both (i) that reasons are explanatorily responsible for there being reason and (ii) that, whereas we can understand individual reasons in terms having reason, we cannot understand having reason in terms of individual reasons.

This leads Fogal to defend a view according to which reasons are explanations for there being reason for an agent to perform some action or have some attitude. He then uses this reductive account to explain both the intra-contextual and inter-contextual variability of reasons-claims. The idea is that explanations of what we have reason to do in terms of reasons are often partial and interest-relative. If this is right, then it is no surprise that we find ourselves having varying intuitions about which considerations are reasons in which cases. Sometimes even the same consideration can seem like a reason and not like a reason in the very same situation if we switch between different sets of background information and interests.

I am still drawn to the view according to which reasons relations are more fundamental than the notion of having reason. Fogal's article, however, poses a serious challenge for more traditional views of this type. Their defenders will have to give a story of why the linguistic intuitions about the reasons/reason pair resembles so much those about the pleasures/pleasure pair, where it is difficult to take the count noun to be more fundamental. Second, their defenders will also need to make sense of the fact that whether a given consideration is a reason in a specific context seems to vary depending on our background information and interests. (For example, it is acceptable to say that the fact that Billy loves dancing is a reason for him to go to the party and that the fact that he loves dancing is a reason, but not that both of these things are reasons at the same time.) I suspect that responding to these challenges will require separating metaphysical facts about reasons from our linguistic intuitions about which reasons claims can be uttered because the latter intuitions are influenced by many pragmatic considerations. Yet, going this route too will require doing philosophical work, which the defenders of reasons have not yet done.

For reasons of space, I will sadly have to be more concise in dealing with two of the volume's more original contributions. Alida Liberman and Mark Schroeder begin from a simple view of how obligations are weighed: if you have a stronger obligation to X than not to X, then you ought to X, from which it follows that if you have an obligation to X but no obligation not to X, then you ought to X too. They then argue that this simple view cannot be true of a certain sub-class of obligations, namely commitments. Because unsupported commitments do not lead to oughts, for example, commitments must be weighed in some more sophisticated way. As a consequence, they suggest that perhaps obligations and reasons more generally cannot be weighed in any simple way either. Kate Manne, in contrast, tries to further develop the traditional Humean account of reasons in two ways. She first argues that we should not attempt to make sense of an agent's reasons solely in terms of her own desires but rather should also take into account whether that agent's actions promote the satisfaction of other people's desires too. She then suggests that we should attempt to understand the strengths of reasons in terms of how fundamental different desires are in different people's psychological makeups. She even attempts to construct a measure for how the fundamentality of desires could be compared interpersonally. I found both of these articles extremely interesting even if some of their ideas were less thoroughly developed. Liberman and Schroeder tell us little about what implications their observations about commitments have for reasons, and Manne doesn't really do much to show that the resulting view is even close to being extensionally adequate.

Overall, I should say, however, that the first six articles make an important philosophical contribution to the understanding of reasons and their weights. I can recommend them for everyone interested in reasons and practical rationality, value theory, and ethical and normative questions in which many different considerations are salient. The rest of the articles are more of a mixed bag for different reasons. If you are familiar with at least some of the philosophical literature on reasons, you probably are already familiar with the views of Joseph Raz, Joshua Gert, Stephen Kearns, and John F. Horty. Their articles do not add significantly to their earlier contributions. The articles by Ruth Chang, Karl Schafer, Stephen Darwall, and Michael Smith and Frank Jackson do contain much more new material, but I am not sure how much I learned from them about the weights of reasons specifically.