Welfare, Meaning, and Worth

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Aaron Smuts, Welfare, Meaning, and Worth, Routledge, 2017, 160pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 97811382166224.

Reviewed by Andrew Moore, University of Otago


Smuts states his mains goals as the development of his favored distinctions among worth, meaning and welfare, plus good theories of these three matters. This review outlines and assesses the book in terms of these goals.

Ch. 1 presents an overview of the book, and introduces its distinctions amongst worth, welfare, and meaning. The monograph focuses on life as a whole, and Ch. 2 appraises historically influential tests for lives worth living, and argues for appeal to what a benevolent caretaker would or wouldn't allow. Smuts takes the book's core theoretical contributions to be its accounts of life's worth (Ch. 3), welfare (Ch. 4), and meaning (Ch. 5). Ch. 6 adds arguments against welfarism in moral theory (declaration of interest: elsewhere, I argue for welfarism in moral theory), Ch.7 considers the value of painful art, and Ch. 8 argues for optimism about life's worth against the pessimism of Schopenhauer, David Benatar, and others.

The worth of lives comes in degrees. Some are worth living, but others are worth avoiding. The latter include lives of evil or great suffering "sufficient to sap life of positive worth" (p. 1). Smuts also writes that "Other things being equal, the more meaningful a life, the more it is worth living". Still, even a largely meaningless life might be worth living. We also "want more than what merely increases our well-being". Life in Nozick's experience machine might be high in well-being, but cannot be high in meaning, and might even be worth avoiding overall. Worth is more than welfare and meaning, and is more important too.

Smuts offers no systematic account of the how welfare, meaning, and worth are related to life overall. This limits the force of his many arguments from the significance of some feature in a life to a conclusion about that life's overall significance. One example is his claim that "a life that significantly advances horrendous evil is not worth living" (p. 28). Another concerns Porky's life of allegedly pig-like sexual pleasures, which is "a life of little value" (p. 61). A third is "the grinning excrement eater" who "does not lead as meaningful of a life as a cancer researcher" (p. 79). Smuts also imagines that "Hitler did something good; he gave a hot meal to a cold, hungry homeless child" (p. 89), but also claims that, even if this is so, "Hitler led a horrendously evil life of no positive meaning" (p. 90).

Smuts develops an objective list theory (OLT) of worth. Objective goods add to life's worth, while objective bads "detract from" it (p. 2). The most worthwhile lives are high in various objective goods. These principally include welfare and meaning. Smuts later argues that welfare is a broadly hedonist matter, and meaning is a matter of good effects. Worth includes further objective goods too: "knowledge, achievement, moral worth (or virtue), and loving relationships" (p. 35), and "perhaps, the appreciation of beauty" (p. 41) and autonomy (pp. 108-9). The good of achievement does not fully reduce to that of good effects (p. 42). His wider view seems to be that none of the four to six objective goods beyond welfare and meaning are fully reducible to pleasure or good effects, whether alone or in combination. In general, his OLT of negative worth parallels his account of positive worth. One exception is his distinctive view that waste is an objective bad. Waste is not trying when one could have tried and succeeded, and it is not reducible to the sort of failure that is the opposite of achievement (p. 44). His discussion would ideally also have responded to the different reductive view that the disvalue of waste wholly reduces to that of the foregone objective goods.

On welfare, the main goal is "to defend the strongest competition to the OLT, mental statism" (p. 51). This "holds that the sole bearers of intrinsic prudential value . . . are phenomenal experiences" (pp. 51-52) (declaration of interest: elsewhere, I argue for the OLT of welfare). Furthermore, "many non-pleasurable experiences appear to be intrinsically prudentially valuable" too, including "flow experiences" (p. 54). Smuts acknowledges but does not deploy the thought that his view "might be better called "experientialism"" (p. 52).

Smuts writes that "objective list theories of welfare gain their principal support from experience machine and grass-counter style examples" (p. 61). He thinks the individuals in such examples have lives that lack meaning and worth, but need not lack welfare. He does not consider the rival orientation that the principal support for OLT of welfare comes instead from diverse positive accounts of the source(s) of well-being, in activity and agency on Aristotelian accounts, cognition and especially knowledge in Socratic theories, relationships as some feminist and diverse other views would have it, and of course in phenomenal or felt experience according to some broadly empiricist accounts.

 In developing his OLT of worth, Smuts pursues the “simple comparison [of] . . . two lives that have equal amounts of other values, but vary only in knowledge, achievement, [or] loving relationships” (42). This approach tracks and assesses OLT's commitments value by value. His critique of OLT of welfare departs from this approach. See below.

The first criticism that Smuts directs against OLT of welfare concerns the person who "takes no pleasure from the objective goods", such as the "cancer researcher . . . [who] made several major discoveries that revolutionized cancer treatment" but "was chronically dissatisfied" (p. 38). To assist Smuts, read into OLT of welfare all the objective goods from his own OLT of worth, and assume the cancer researcher secures two achievements. OLT of welfare then implies the researcher's welfare is good with respect to these two achievements. Assuming OLT also implies that being miserable is an objective bad, the researcher's welfare is also bad in this respect. But this OLT simply leaves it an open question whether or not the bad of misery here outweighs the good of achievement, or vice versa. This OLT and this test case lack the determinacy needed to underwrite any other verdict. The verdict Smuts reaches is instead that OLT "incorrectly implies that a miserable person whose life is otherwise high in objective goods lives a life high in individual welfare" (p. 48). This makes a major post-facto revision to the test case, by supposing the researcher has objective goods here well beyond just the two achievements. Even if this were granted, OLT would still not have the implication that Smuts attributes to it. A related basic problem is the case's non-adherence to value-by-value assessment of OLT, due to its having two moving parts in achievement and misery. In sum, this is not a good argument against OLT of welfare.

The second argument against OLT focuses on someone with all the objective goods, including a lot of appreciation. We imagine the level of appreciation fixed, but an increase in another good, "such as the significance or generality of the knowledge". Smuts concludes: "it's painfully hard to see how this change improves the value of the life for the one who lives it" (p. 39). Any OLT that lists knowledge does imply that its increase is sufficient for some benefit. But the case description is so abstract that it is painfully hard to see much at all from it, especially as the crucial change involved is only a minor difference in one sort of good. As noted above, Smuts also presents no systematic account of relations between welfare in life and welfare of life. This leaves him without resource to resist the reply that so small a change in knowledge, like many a small change in pleasure, is insufficient for any change in the overall welfare of life. Smuts makes no clear case here against OLT.

The third criticism is that OLT "makes it non-trivial to account for self-sacrifice, far more difficult than is plausible". The idea is that OLT implies there are "prudential benefits of the moral value of self-sacrifice", but, to the contrary, it's plausible to think that "self-sacrifice doesn't have any intrinsic benefit" (p. 39) and OLT thus "precludes a plausible account of self-sacrifice" (p. 48). Smuts here misinterprets OLT. It can agree with him that self-sacrifice per se is not a prudential benefit, and is typically a prudential harm. Similarly, an OLT might either affirm or deny the claim that moral worth in itself is a benefit to its subject. Oddly, Smuts approvingly quotes here an instance of this very point from the OLT of Brad Hooker: "moral worth does not have any intrinsic prudential value per se" (p. 40).  Yet he also ignores Hooker's thesis in the same article that morality enters prudence only as an instance of the wider prudential good of achievement. This third criticism of OLT fails too.

Smuts sees "formidable problems" here that show OLT is "highly implausible" (p. 40). His verdict is that it "faces fatal objections." (p. 48). The present assessment is less positive. The welfare chapter has further weaknesses. It does little to contextualize its topic within the extensive literature on hedonism, in contrast to the excellent contextualizing jobs he does in the earlier chapters. Smuts also seems so embedded in his own experientialist orientation to welfare that he tends to see rivals as "driven" (p. 67) or "blinkered" or as "operating under the persuasion of" a theory, or as "theoretically motivated" (p. 68). Awkwardness arises, too, from his thought that "Pleasure is a subjective state, but it is objectively good" (p. 42). That seems to make his own broadly hedonist account an instance of OLT of welfare. He would ideally have explained how he squares this with his rejection of OLT of welfare. Still, his particular criticisms of OLT do not seem to clash with his experientialist OLT.

Ch. 5 asks: "What makes a life meaningful?". It answers: "One's life is meaningful to the extent that it promotes the good", and has negative meaning to the extent that it promotes the bad. Smuts rejects counterfactual theories of causation, so the good or bad effects are those actually caused, whether or not they would have ensued otherwise. His is "an objectivist theory of the meaning of life". His calling it "the good cause theory" (GCA), might suggest one's purpose or intention or cause is central, but it is not. Merely causing the good is sufficient. "The best . . . GCA includes accidental outcomes in the calculation of the meaning of life" (p. 85) and "What matters is whether we are indeed causally responsible for significant good. If so, our lives are meaningful" (p. 86). Nor need one have any awareness of one's effects. This is really a 'good caused' or 'good effects' theory. Having set out its general contours, he argues that it is superior to subjectivism and to hybrid accounts.

Smuts acknowledges there are "difficult details that a fully fleshed out theory will have to specify", and also hard cases to face. One such concerns the significance of a Susan Wolf variation on the Sisyphus tale, in which the downward roll of the rock thwarts village-disrupting vultures and thereby makes the endless task of Sisyphus have good effects (p. 85). In another case, Victor Frankl's imagined medical ape is "repeatedly poked with long needles to extract a spinal fluid required for the production of a life-saving serum" (p. 28), yet the ape lacks any awareness or understanding of these purposes and effects. Smuts later reflects: "It's not entirely clear to me that Frankl's ape stands in the appropriate relationship to goods that result from the serum" (p. 87). Also tricky is "the evil banker" Potter, whose rapacious activity causes George Bailey to live a life richly productive of good. Smuts comments: "If . . . the GCA does indeed imply that Potter's life is meaningful because of its effect on George, this is a troubling implication". He toys here with denying that causation is transitive, at least beyond a certain "distance" (p. 87). But he thinks an "even stronger objection to the GCA" arises from a malevolent individual who devotes himself to hurting and destroying, yet actually causes massive good (p. 88). Smuts nevertheless seems to stand by the GCA in all these cases. His response to a further "case of the immortal" is more puzzling. This life endlessly produces good outcomes, albeit in a repetitious manner, so GCA seems to deliver the odd assessment that it has infinite positive meaning. Yet Smuts writes that "a life of endless repetition does not pose a problem for the good cause account" (pp. 91-92).

Smuts notes that in the production of good and bad effects, even inanimate entities "might play a causal role . . . much like the presence of oxygen plays in arson" (p. 92). He does not note the related point that the GCA's bare causalism seems to commit it to the idea that the existence of any animate or inanimate entity whatever "is meaningful to the extent that it promotes the good" (p. 89). Especially when conjoined with the transitivity of causation, this spreads meaning far and wide, unconstrained by any requirement of awareness or intention or understanding.

The meaning chapter has further weaknesses. Smuts often seems to focus on additions or subtractions of meaning, more than on the overall meaning of life or in life. Hence his frequent phrase "counts in favour of meaningfulness". Yet sometimes he seems to focus instead on the meaning of life overall; for example: "What matters is whether we are indeed causally responsible for significant good. If so, our lives are meaningful" (p. 86). Relatedly, the chapter is not crystal clear on whether its good effects condition is on overall meaning, or just on addition of meaning. Another issue is that although his theory seems to be closely related to other well-established causalist or consequentialist accounts of meaning, he does not draw on these kinships or even note them. The chapter also makes few connections to the established wider literature on objectivist accounts of life's meaning.

Smuts has written here a valuable addition to the literatures on welfare, meaning, and worth. His thoroughgoing objectivism about all three matters is distinctive. And there are still not many published accounts of objective goods, fewer accounts of objective bads, and fewer still that develop both of these together in a theory of worth. The book is short, well-structured, clear, and vigorous. To good effect, it makes and draws on a wide range of historical, literary, and filmic connections. Its endnotes alone contain many suggestive insights. The proof-reading is imperfect, but even this has upside. My favorites were "the organ-ravishing drug" (p. 68), and this appraisal of marriage: "I don't want to get marred, ever, to anyone" (p. 99).