Most theorists accept the harm thesis: death is bad for some of those it annihilates. Such theorists face three Epicurean challenges: to clarify the subject of mortal harm (the harm for which death is responsible), the nature of mortal harm, and the time when that subject incurs that harm. Everyone now agrees that the subject of mortal harm is the very person who dies. Nearly everyone also agrees that death harms us by depriving us of goods, but precisely what the relevant goods are remains a matter of contention. The third challenge has generated more controversy; it is not clear when mortal harm is accrued, or even that it is accrued at some time. Nevetheless most theorists agree on this much: subsequentism, the view that death’s victims are worse off posthumously, is false, as harm cannot be accrued by something while it is nonexistent.
In Well-being and Death Ben Bradley addresses these challenges. He accepts the standard answer to the first, but his approaches to the other two are anything but standard. His solutions to the second and third, respectively, are hedonism and subsequentism, and he defends them resourcefully, mostly by criticizing the alternatives, in the first three chapters of his book. In Chapter 4 he argues that usually it is worse to die in infancy than later, and that, while the demise of a fetus might be the worst death of all, abortion may be permissible. In the last chapter he argues that there is nothing sensible we can do to make our deaths less bad for us.
In what follows I sketch Bradley’s account of welfare (well-being) and interests, then critically discuss his case for subsequentism.
Bradley defends a version of the standard comparativist account of interests in Chapter 2. He says that an event (or state of affairs) E is overall good (bad) for a subject, S, just when, and to the extent that, the intrinsic value of the actual world for S is higher (lower) than the intrinsic value of the closest possible world in which E does not occur (or hold). (Cf. Bradley’s “Difference-Making Principle”, p. 50, which has further refinements.) As for the intrinsic value of some world W for S, it equals the value of the intrinsic goods S attains in W together with the (dis)value of the intrinsic evils S attains there.
Comparativism does not tell us what is intrinsically valuable. In Chapter 1 Bradley supplies an account, opting for the hedonist view that (the state of affairs of our getting) pleasure is the only thing that is intrinsically good for a subject S, while pain is the only thing that is intrinsically bad for S. He adds that how well off S is — S’s welfare level — is determined by the sum of S’s pleasure and pain. Together with hedonism, comparativism implies that things are in (against) S’s interests to the extent that they make S more (less) pleased than S otherwise would have been.
Let us turn to Bradley’s defense of subsequentism. To follow it, we must distinguish between E’s overall value for S (simpliciter), as just defined, and E’s overall value for S at a time. Unlike the former, which is defined in terms of the intrinsic value of a world, the latter is defined in terms of the intrinsic value of a time T in a world W, which equals the value of the intrinsic goods S attains in W at T together with the (dis)value of the intrinsic evils. The overall value of E for S in W at T equals the intrinsic value of T in W minus the intrinsic value of T in the nearest world in which E fails to occur. Thus E is good (bad) for S at T just when E’s overall value for S at T is greater (less) than zero.
Illustration: I refuse to move to Tahiti; each day of my remaining fifteen years is unpleasant; had I moved, I still would have died fifteen years later, but the first fourteen would have been pleasant, and the last extremely unpleasant. Comparativism says my decision is bad for me. Bradley adds that it is bad for me during the next fourteen years but good during my final year.
To defend subsequentism, Bradley equates S’s death makes S worse off at T than S would otherwise have been with S’s death is bad for S at T, then argues that bad deaths are bad for their victims posthumously. The claim that death’s victims are worse off posthumously presupposes that they have some welfare level while nonexistent, so he also tries to show that the dead have a welfare level.
To bolster his view that the dead have a welfare level, Bradley discusses two cases:
Marsha: from birth, she lacks the capacity to attain any intrinsic good or evil.
Greg: from birth, he has a normal capacity to attain intrinsic goods and evils, but he never does so.
Does Marsha or Greg have a welfare level? I think that Greg does. Marsha doesn’t; she is utterly vegetative, perhaps anencephalic. Bradley says my response “just seems wrong”; both “have a well-being level of zero” (p. 103, 104).
Suppose Bradley is correct. What gives Marsha a zero welfare level? Is it her inability to attain intrinsic goods or evils? As far as I can tell, claiming that something has a zero welfare level on the grounds that it cannot accrue goods or evils is like saying that something has a temperature of zero because it is incapable of having a mean molecular kinetic energy. The number 5 can have no such mean, but it does not have a temperature. Having no temperature (or welfare level) is not the same as having a zero temperature (or welfare level).
There is another problem with saying that Marsha’s inability gives her a zero welfare level. Let’s stipulate that a subject who at T lacks the capacity to attain anything that is intrinsically good or evil is unresponsive at T (this is a departure from Bradley’s [and my own former] usage; see Bradley, p. 102; Luper, p. 132). Many things, such as shoes and the number 5, are unresponsive like Marsha yet have no welfare level.
So what gives normal people and not shoes a welfare level? I would say it is responsiveness itself:
A: S has a welfare level at T iff S has the capacity to attain intrinsic goods or evils at T.
Even at times when they are asleep or in reversible comas, normal adults have this capacity, while corpses and shoes never do. Sleep and comas can temporarily block people from exercising a capacity without removing it.
Bradley admits (but see p. 104, note 58) that shoes do not have a welfare level. He insists, however, that dead people (and Marsha) do. So what explains the difference? A person, he says,
is the sort of thing that can be benefited or harmed. So perhaps the difference between a dead person and a shoe is this: a person who is dead at T nevertheless has a positive or negative well-being level at some time, at some possible world. The same cannot be said of a shoe, which seems to be the sort of thing that could not possibly have a welfare level (p. 104).
Bradley appears to reason as follows:
1. S is the sort of thing that can be benefited or harmed at some time iff it is metaphysically possible for S to attain goods or evils at some time.
2. S has a welfare level at T only if S is the sort of thing that can be benefited or harmed at some time.
3. So S has a welfare level at T only if it is metaphysically possible for S to attain goods or evils at some time (cf. R on p. 104).
4. Shoes cannot possibly have a positive or negative welfare level at some time. People possibly can.
5. So at no time do shoes have a welfare level.
6. So at no time do people lack a welfare level.
This reasoning has a hole, of course; while 5 follows from 3 and 4, 6 does not. (Unlike 6, 3 is compatible with A.) Just because something (is the sort of thing that) is such that its attaining goods or evils at some time is not impossible, it does not follow that it has a welfare level at some given time, or at every time.
Still, there is an obvious fix; we can convert 2 and 3 into biconditionals:
2a. S has a welfare level at T iff S is the sort of thing that can be benefited or harmed at some time.
3a. S has a welfare level at T iff it is metaphysically possible for S to attain goods or evils at some time.
Now we have a valid argument for 6. Is it sound? Consider arguing that people never lack a temperature on the basis of the following unsound argument:
a. S is the sort of thing that can have a temperature at some time iff it is metaphysically possible for S to have a positive or negative temperature at some time.
b. S has a temperature at T iff S is the sort of thing that can have a temperature at some time.
c. So S has a temperature at T iff it is metaphysically possible for S to have a positive or negative temperature at some time.
d. Numbers cannot possibly have a positive or negative temperature at some time. People possibly can.
e. So at no time do numbers have a temperature.
f. So at no time do people lack a temperature.
For something actually to have a temperature level at all times, it hardly suffices that it (be the sort of thing that) can have a positive or negative temperature level at some time, or even that it does have a temperature level at some time. People and shoes have temperatures but not before they exist or after they are annihilated. Are 2a and 3a any more plausible than b and c? If so why? On 3a welfare levels are very strange things indeed. If something could ever have a welfare level it cannot lack one, even while nonexistent.
The following proposal seems more promising than 3a:
3b. S has a welfare level at T iff it is metaphysically possible for S to have a positive or negative welfare level at T.
On 3a, anything that ever has a welfare level has one throughout the eternity that precedes its existence — even if it could not possibly have a positive or negative level then. At least 3b does not imply that. But why should we accept 3b? Why is the claim it makes about welfare more plausible than the corresponding claim about temperature; viz., S has a temperature at T iff it is metaphysically possible for S to have a positive or negative temperature at T? Why prefer it over A?
Bradley concludes Chapter 4 with a “positive argument” for his view that the dead have welfare levels (p. 108). He thinks his view is supported by the fact that it is reasonable for a person, say Kris, to be (prudentially) indifferent as between two futures that might follow his being struck by an anvil at T: F1, being killed instantly, or F2, being made comatose for the ten years prior to death. Bradley thinks that Kris’s indifference makes sense only if F1 and F2 have (the same) value for Kris, which in turn entails that Kris has a welfare level during F1 — i.e., at a time when he is dead. However, I suggest that we can make good sense of F1 and F2 having the same value for Kris even though he has no welfare level while dead. In fact, we can assess the times during which F1 and F2 unfold, and we can do this in terms of what Bradley calls their intrinsic value. During F1, Kris fails to exist, and attains neither goods nor evils, so the sum of their values is 0. During F2, he exists, but still attains neither, so the sum is again 0. Now, there is an intimate relationship between a subject S’s welfare level at T and the value of T for S as assessed in terms of intrinsic goods and evils; whenever S has any welfare level at all, the two coincide. However, the fact that T has a value for S as assessed in terms of S’s goods and evils is not equivalent to, and does not imply, the claim that S has a welfare level at T (regrettably, in my own past work I was not always clear about this). For any time T, the value for my shoe at time T, measured in terms of the goods and evils it has at T, is always 0, but it never has a welfare level.
The upshot is this: if we understand subsequentism to imply that death makes its victim worse off after she dies than she otherwise would have been (as Bradley does in at least some places; see p. 98), then Bradley has given us no reason to accept it. Presumably the claim that E makes S worse off at T than S otherwise would have been means that S has a welfare level at T that is not as high as the welfare level S would have had at T had E not occurred. On Bradley’s account, what is implied by the claim that E is overall bad for S at T is just that E made T less valuable for S, as assessed in terms of things that are intrinsically good or evil for S, than T would otherwise have been. That T is, in this sense, less valuable for S does not imply that S has a welfare level at T. Similarly, the fact that Kris’s death is overall bad for Kris at lots of times T after he died means that his death made T less valuable for Kris, as assessed in terms of things that are intrinsically good or evil for Kris, than T would otherwise have been, and not that he has a welfare level at T that is lower than the welfare level he would have at T in the closest world in which he does not die.
As will be evident by now, Bradley’s book is chock full of interesting and fruitful ideas. It advances the scholarly debate about death and its harmfulness. Anyone who contributes to or follows that debate will want to read Well-being and Death.1
Bradley, Ben, 2009, Well-being and Death, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
Luper, Steven, 2009, The Philosophy of Death, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.