Well-Being and Fair Distribution: Beyond Cost-Benefit Analysis

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Matthew D. Adler, Well-Being and Fair Distribution: Beyond Cost-Benefit Analysis, Oxford University Press, 2012, 656pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195384994.

Reviewed by Mark Sagoff, George Mason University


In the Introduction to this excellent book, Matthew Adler states that it aims to provide "a comprehensive, philosophically grounded, defense of the use of social welfare functions as a framework for evaluating governmental policies and other large-scale choices." His argument assumes the epistemic possibility of discerning and measuring the comparative welfare effects of given policy options. "In other words, this book works within welfarism, rather than engaging ongoing debates between welfarists and non-welfarists." (xiii)

In its ambition -- to defend within the four corners of welfarism a particular version of the social welfare function (SWF) -- this book represents a stunning achievement. It is definitive along many dimensions. It is definitive for the intellectual clarity and rigor it brings to a defense within welfarism of a SWF approach that analyzes well-being in terms of the "fully informed, fully rational, extended preferences" of everyone in the population and that "allows for interper­sonal comparisons of utility" (155). It is definitive for its comprehensiveness: it explores to a fare-thee-well every welfarist objection to this way of estimating and comparing utilities. It is definitive in its critique of competing welfarist positions, for example, those associated with cost-benefit analysis, Kaldor-Hicks efficiency, and the reliance on willingness to pay (WTP) or to accept (WTA) as measures of well-being. This book is so definitive that further discussion of welfarism must reckon with it. Anyone who wants to comment intelligently on the welfarist program from within it must first master the intricate and difficult argument of this book -- a bar to market entry so high that it ought to dissuade all but the most erudite or intrepid theoreticians.

The first chapter, "Preliminaries," points out that as a moral framework for policy evaluation, welfarism must be person-centered and consequentialist in the broad Paretian sense that it ranks outcomes in terms of the well-being of all those they affect. Adler immediately raises the obvious question: "The reader may wonder why I purport to defend the SWF approach as a framework for morally evaluating governmental policies." (13) This is a good question because someone could argue that the evaluation of governmental policies should be based on other norms, such as the rights of person and property, a constitutional order that facilitates voluntary association and consensual exchange, and the rule of law. On the contrary, as Adler argues, a decision procedure rooted in "a written Constitution, statutes, regulations, or case law . . . is a different process from morally evaluating the choice, and may reach a different conclusion about which choice 'ought' to be performed." (12)

Welfare economists begin with the assumption that an authority (e.g., themselves) or a perspective (e.g., their own) exists that can foresee and compare the welfare consequences of different policy options. Once this assumption is granted and moral evaluation is equated with consequences for well-being, then it follows that restrictions on state power such as personal and property rights ought not to impede the promulgation of moral-because-welfare-maximizing actions. Concepts such as markets, exchange, prices, personal and property rights, a consti­tutional order, and the rule of law are virtually absent from this book; none of these terms is found in the index. The absence of such of concepts does not suggest a nearsightedness in the argument but exemplifies its intellectual rigor and honesty.

A theory is welfarist, Adler writes, "if it tells the decision maker to characterize outcomes, as far as possible, in terms of the various sources of human well-being; and to rank outcomes as a sole function of human well-being" in a way that satisfies Pareto conditions. (32) If taken as a prescription for government policy, regulation, intervention, etc. (a big if), welfarism regards the allocation and distribution of resources as the responsibility of a benign social planner who applies a SWF of the right kind. This beneficent leader would occupy the commanding heights to direct the economy and -- since he or she is omniscient and benevolent -- would offer moral prescriptions that therefore would not and should not be subject to the rule of law.

In Chapter 2, Adler introduces the SWF he defends. It "yields a quasiordering of outcomes by using a set U of utility functions and a rule R for ranking utility vectors" which are carefully described in mathematical terms throughout the book. This quasiordering allows for interper­sonal comparisons between potential life histories. Adler takes pains to defend "a social-evaluation framework such that the 'currency' for ranking outcomes is not well-being, but responsibly adjusted well-being." (37) Adler defends this approach ably against a skepticism about interpersonal comparisons that remains so widespread in the economics discipline "that many economists regard welfare economics as being a 'dead' field." (89). The rest of the chapter shows that it would be a dead field if it did not allow interpersonal comparisons of utility. Adler dismisses WTP/WTA and Kaldor-Hicks efficiency tests in part with arguments he offered with devastating effect in an earlier book, New Foundations for Cost-Benefit Analysis (2006), co-authored with Eric Posner. For example: preferences "might be poorly informed, less than fully rational, or non-self-interested." (93)

In Chapter 3, Adler develops the idea (citing John Harsanyi) of an "extended preference" which is "a preference for life-histories -- and the use of expected utility (EU) theory to represent individuals' extended preferences." (192) In Chapters 3 and 4 he spells out in formal terms how one may derive for each individual the utility set that represents "her fully informed, fully rational extended preferences regarding life-histories, life history lotteries, and comparisons to non-existence." (231) The chapter also begins a complex and subtle account of how these utility sets may be pooled across everyone in a subject population.

Chapter 5 examines and defends, among other things, the view that there is no inconsistency between welfarism and fairness. Welfarism takes people as equal (as utilitarian philosophies do) and respects the separateness of individuals in weighing their life histories rather than merely aggregating their preferences. Adler describes an intricate rule to produce a complete ranking of all utility vectors that adopts a "prioritarian" conception of fairness in distribution. This commitment to fairness, for which Adler finds many sources in the literature, assigns a declining marginal moral weight to well-being; in other words, it gives relatively more moral significance to changes in the well-being of those with less of it.

Chapter 6 defends the "whole lifetime" view of utility and offers a helpful discussion of personal identity over time (see, e.g., 409). This discussion may fall a little short because it does not confront the relevant arguments put forward by David Velleman in Philosophy and Public Affairs 36(3) (2008). There Velleman suggests that intrapersonal comparisons of utility -- and a fortiori intrapersonal comparisons of life histories -- are impossible because the individual does not care enough about those of his possible lives he does not lead to value them properly. The best we can do is to compare alternative futures to our current situation; we cannot compare alternative life histories with each other. If individuals do not care enough about lives they do not lead to assess their comparative utility, can the benevolent leader succeed in doing this for them? Velleman poses an important challenge to the idea that the individual can compare possible life histories with each other; it would be interesting to see how Adler would respond to this skepticism.

The next chapter describes methodological difficulties the decision-maker confronts in developing the set U of utility functions for each individual and relating them to alternative choices in view of a host of problems such as "an incomplete outcome ordering, uncertainty concerning the outcome ranking, and strategic interaction." (479) Adler discusses the cognitive limitations of the decision-maker, which he describes in terms of uncertainty. He looks through the literature of welfare economics, which in this instance is empty, to find out how a decision-maker could access all the needed information. "While much scholarship attempts to refine EU theory so as to accommodate an incomplete ordering of outcomes or imprecise probabilities, I am not sure of any formal work that grapples with the possibility of decision-maker uncertainty about the ordering. (546)

The book concludes in Chapter 8 by drawing attention to the familiar truth that law and morality may differ. Adler employs the well-known example (this might be the only example of any kind in the book) of the over- and under-inclusiveness from a utilitarian perspective of traffic laws. It would be disastrous, Adler concedes, for the law to require that one "drive at a morally appropriate rate of speed and in a morally appropriate manner." (557) In fact, the law may for many good reasons prohibit this kind of appeal to moral judgment and prevent those in authority from imposing their moral wisdom, however well it applies the axioms Adler carefully codifies. Entrusting public officials to make the SWF call might create social uncertainty and even invite chicanery. Accordingly, "It might be morally preferable to have . . . public laws that prohibit officials . . . from using SWFs to evaluate their choices, and that instead legally obligate them to employ a different sort of choice procedure" (558).

Indeed, public laws such as the Clean Air and Clean Water Acts explicitly prohibit the use of cost-benefit analysis (CBA) in regulatory decision-making. This prohibition has been routinely upheld by the courts. (Adler makes this point on p. 570.) Regulatory agencies often paper their decisions with favorable CBAs for purposes of review at the Office of Information and Regulatory Affairs, but scholars who have studied this practice over decades conclude that the CBA is typically an ex post and ad hoc exercise that has little to do with the legal, political, and bureaucratic reasoning that goes into regulatory decision-making. The problem of replication besets any SWF approach to policymaking. Would two groups of economists working separ­ately -- especially if funded by opposing interests -- come to anything like the same conclusions? Any interest group can prepare a CBA (or SWF) and dueling CBAs are not uncommon.

Robert Hahn, a prominent economist who studies CBA concedes, "The relationship between analysis and policy decisions is tenuous." He adds, "There is little evidence that economic analysis of regulatory decisions has had a substantial positive impact" in part because CBAs are generally poorly done and are of dubious replicability. (See Robert W. Hahn, "An Evaluation of Government Efforts to Improve Regulatory Decision Making," International Review of Environmental and Resource Economics, 2009, 3: 245-298). (Adler discusses some of Hahn's earlier work along these lines at p. 569.)

Toward the end of the last chapter, Adler points out that "it is critical to distinguish between the status of the SWF as a framework for moral valuation, and the question of its morally appropriate legal role." (566) Before concluding the book with further technical and formal analysis of the SWF, Adler inquires about the "optimality of a legal regime instructing government officials to employ SWFs as opposed to some other choice-evaluation procedure" such as the one represented by due process in the Constitution, personal and political rights, respect for private property, and related ideals and norms associated with classical liberalism. Adler says all one can: whether the SWF approach should empower public officials "depends on the cognitive and motivational characteristics of those officials." (567)

By nodding to the cognitive and motivational limitations of those who employ the cold steel of the law, Adler acknowledges the most significant critique of this position that can be mounted from outside of welfarism. This would be the well-known arguments associated with "Invisible Hand" or free market institutions such as are advocated by Von Mises and Hayek and with the dyspepsia about the use of state power associated James Buchanan and Gordon Tullock.

Economists in the tradition of Adam Smith warn against the fatal conceit that knowledge about well-being and about the welfare consequences of choices that is dispersed across society can be captured by any individual or state council. It is customary to quote Smith:

The statesman who should attempt to direct private people in what manner they ought to employ their capitals would not only load himself with most unnecessary attention but assume an authority which could safely be trusted to no council and senate whatever, and which would nowhere be so dangerous as in the hands of a man who has folly and presumption enough to fancy himself fit to exercise it.

According to Hayek, Smith's chief concern "was not so much with what man might occasionally achieve when he was at his best but that he should have as little opportunity as possible to do harm when he was at his worst." To empower public officials to conceive and execute SWFs is to maximize this kind of opportunity. Government officials, as Tullock and others have argued, represent economic actors in pursuit of their own power and interest -- which they have to pursue earnestly to attain positions of authority -- and cannot be assumed to have cognitive and motivational capacities or virtues superior to those of the ordinary person.

From the perspective of economists in the Austrian tradition, welfarism is incompatible with capitalism. This is because welfarism concerns allocation and distribution while capitalism has to do with exchange. The argument is often made that welfarism not only is incompatible with capitalism but invites socialism. This invitation comes across loud and clear when Adler con­structs a SWF based for each individual on "her fully informed, fully rational extended prefer­ences regarding life-histories, life history lotteries, and comparisons to non-existence." For socialists like Stalin, a fully informed rational individual is one who is free of corrupt class conscious­ness. Apparatchiks of a Welfarist Party, guided by a nomenklatura of economists, could enforce their own views of what counts as an informed, fully rational, extended preference.

While criticisms such as these from outside welfarism are easy to make against Adler's study, they are irrelevant and even unfair to it. At the outset, Adler deflects these kinds of animadversions by stating that his book works within welfarism and does not engage in debates between welfarists and non-welfarists. As such, Well-Being and Fair Distribution represents a great achievement. It commands the entire literature of welfare economics and against that back­ground defines and defends a SWF that is truly groundbreaking along many dimensions, for example, in its use of interpersonal comparisons of utility across alternative life histories. Any economist who wishes to engage in the discussion of SWFs and their relevance to the moral evaluation of govern­mental policies will have to work through the detailed, thorough, and formal argument of this book. This would be a significant undertaking.

To read this book carefully is to be drawn to the conclusion that nothing more need be or possibly can be said within welfarism. This 635-page tome stands like the Minotaur guarding the labyrinth of welfare economics. No one should be so foolhardy as to believe that he or she, like Theseus, can overcome this Minotaur and then follow a thread of thought back to anything that anyone but a small coterie of academics could possibly understand. This book provides an important service because of the length, depth, and complexity of its reasoning. This book is so brilliant it does not just bang another nail in the coffin of welfare economics. It is the coffin itself.