Well-Being and Theism: Linking Ethics to God

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William A. Lauinger, Well-Being and Theism: Linking Ethics to God, Continuum Publishing, 2012, 195pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441100306.

Reviewed by Joshua C. Thurow, The University of Texas, San Antonio


To most philosophers, talk of linking ethics to God brings to mind the divine command theory and the Euthyphro problem. Others may think of the claim that one can't be moral without believing in God. William Lauinger's new book entirely ignores these classic issues. He believes that there is an important link between ethics and God, but the link is quite different from links forged in the classic issues. Lauinger argues that the best account of well-being -- or welfare or prudential value (he treats these terms as synonymous) -- makes a metaphysical assumption that is best explained by God's existence.

The book is divided into two parts. In the first Lauinger argues against the two main families of theories of well-being: pro-attitude and objectivist theories. He then develops his own theory -- the desire-perfectionism theory -- which is a hybrid on which something is an aspect of one's well-being only if it is, or is an instance of, one of the objective goods, although the objective goods and their instances are not automatically in themselves aspects of one's well-being. One must also desire the objective goods in order for them and their instances to affect one's well-being. The desire-perfectionism theory also presumes that the vast majority of humans have built into them desires for many of the basic intrinsic goods .

In the second part, Lauinger argues that the best explanation for why humans have such a desire is that God has created and somehow (perhaps using evolution as a tool) instilled these desires into humans. He considers and rejects two alternative explanations: (i) unguided evolution (which he argues is inadequate), and (ii) Aristotelian hylomorphism (which he argues is adequate, but itself makes assumptions that are best explained by God's action). He then concludes with an argument that desire is not satisfied until it obtains an infinite good and a discussion of how this infinite character of desire fits with theism. Lauinger's critiques of pro-attitude and objectivist theories of well-being are careful, well-presented, and insightful, although I believe there is a version of the desire-fulfillment theory that both evades his objections and is suggested by his responses to objections to his own desire-perfectionism theory. His inference to theism is questionable both in itself and given this other version of the desire-fulfillment theory, which seems to avoid all of his objections and yet does not itself support theism.

The pro-attitude family of theories of well-being hold that one's actual or counterfactual pro-attitudes determine what things affect one's well-being. Lauinger aims his criticisms of this family at one particular member -- desire-fulfillment theories -- but he thinks his objections will hold just as well against other family members. He carefully and persuasively levels a number of well-known objections against these theories. People's desires change and it isn't clear whether past, present, or future desires are what matter for well-being. There are cases in which something matters for one's welfare even though it does not fulfill one's desires. For instance, one may never have heard of bluegrass music, and so not desire it, and yet attending a bluegrass festival is relevant to one's welfare because one would enjoy it. Some people desire things -- such as money, fame, and smoking -- that, it seems, do not improve their welfare. Then there are dead-sea apples: cases where one desires X but the attractiveness of X dissolves once it is obtained. Fulfilling such desires does not seem to improve one's welfare. Lauinger considers and rejects second-order and hypothetical desire-fulfillment theories, arguing that both suffer from versions of the same problems and in addition face their own problems.

Lauinger's chief problem with objectivist theories is that they do not "adequately capture the for part of 'prudentially good for'" (58). Simply obtaining a bunch of objective, perfectionist, goods isn't good for me unless those goods somehow connect up with my own desires and cares. Perfectionist goods are good for me as the kind of being I am, but are not necessarily good for me as an individual; well-being concerns the latter and the latter seems to require that we somehow psychologically internalize the goods.

The desire-perfectionism theory aims to avoid the problems with purely pro-attitude theories on the one hand, and purely objectivist theories on the other. Basically, by combining aspects of each theory, the weaknesses of each are avoided. X improves one's well-being only if X is a perfectionist good (or an instance of a perfectionist good), where the perfectionist goods include things like accomplishment, aesthetic experience, health, friendship, pleasure, and knowledge. This objectivist requirement enables the theory to avoid problems for the pro-attitude theories (such as the problem of which desires count and the problem of people who desire things that don't increase their well-being). In addition, X improves one's well-being only if X satisfies some desire that one has. Obtaining a completely undesired objective good does not improve one's well-being. Lauinger's theory thus avoids the main problem with objectivist theories by requiring that the basic perfectionist goods be desired in order for instances of those goods to improve one's well-being.

The objectivist will of course retort, "what about cases of people who don't desire the objective goods? Doesn't obtaining these goods still increase their well-being?" Lauinger's reply is interesting. First, he says that he will only consider "non-fantastical" cases because "the concept of welfare that we are all theorizing and arguing about . . . may well apply only to humans in our world or environment and to humans in worlds or environments that are relevantly like ours" (19). So, no Mr. McEars whose sole desire in life is to scratch his ear. Second, he claims that every non-fantastical case has one of the following features: (i) the person in the case does desire the perfectionist goods, but he/she is blocked from manifesting that desire for some reason, or (ii) the person does not desire some perfectionist good G, but there isn't good reason for thinking that G is part of the person's welfare. In effect, then, he argues that "the vast majority of humans have built-in, stable desires for the basic goods [i.e. the perfectionist goods described above]" (86), although typically we are not directly conscious of these desires. In those rare cases where a human lacks a desire for one of these goods, that good does not affect his well-being.

I now want to present a desire-fulfillment theory that seems to be as dialectically stable as the Desire-Perfectionist view. By "dialectically stable" I mean that it avoids all of the objections to the desire-fulfillment theories and the objectivist theories, and it can use the same sort of resources that Lauinger uses to defend his own theory in order to resist other objections. The basic idea of the theory is this: X improves S's well-being iff X is the object of one of S's most basic, stable desires, or X is an instance of one of S's most basic, stable desires. Assume, along with Lauinger, that the vast majority of humans have basic, stable desires for accomplishment, aesthetic experience, health, friendship, pleasure, and knowledge. This theory avoids the objections to desire-fulfillment theories, for it identifies which desires matter for well-being. Desiring fame doesn't increase one's welfare because it doesn't fit well with the basic and stable human desires (well, it might give one some pleasure, and so increase well-being to some degree, but Lauinger would seem committed to this result as well). Dead-sea apples don't increase well-being because desires for them in fact don't fit with the basic and stable desires. Obviously, this theory explains the for part of "prudentially good for."

What about people who lack one of the standard basic human desires? This theory can say the same thing that Lauinger says: for those rare people, obtaining health or friendship (for example) actually isn't prudentially good for them. It might seem odd for a desire-fulfillment theory to say that one type of desire -- the basic, stable ones -- matters for well-being while other types don't. But, basic and stable desires arguably are significant because their objects are what matter most to the agent. In this respect, the theory I have outlined draws on a motivation for second-order and hypothetical desire-fulfillment theories since second-order and hypothetical desires allegedly also indicate what matters more to the agent.

What about people who have a basic desire to hurt others; does fulfilling this desire improve their well-being? Given Lauinger's assumption about human desires, most cases of such people are likely fantastical, and so can be dismissed given Lauinger's method. There may be realistic cases of such people (we'd need details), but many of their desires could perhaps be explained as not being deep and stable; their desires may arise from lack of information, temporary rage, etc.

Suppose there are some (perhaps rare) people who have a basic desire to hurt people. Desire-perfectionist theory would say that fulfilling this desire does not improve one's well-being, but the desire-fulfillment theory under consideration would say that it does. But, then again, the desire-perfectionist theory implies that doing what is right doesn't improve the well-being of those who don't care about virtue and doing what is right, and doing what is wrong doesn't decrease the well-being of such people. Is this any more plausible than the implications of the theory I outlined? Perhaps Lauinger would modify his theory so that violations of the goods can reduce well-being (regardless of whether you desire the goods or not), but obtaining the goods can't increase one's well-being unless one desires the goods. But, this would be an odd view: if desire is so crucial to making something prudentially good for me, why wouldn't it also be crucial for making something prudentially bad for me? Desire is what is needed to explain the 'for' part in the former case, so it would seem that it is needed in the latter as well.

No doubt much more could be said about this version of the desire-fulfillment theory. But, it seems approximately as dialectically stable as Lauinger's desire-perfectionist theory.

The second part of the book is crammed with a wealth of interesting and controversial arguments. Here I will focus my attention on his argument that evolution on its own cannot explain why humans desire the basic perfectionist goods. By my reading, his argument goes as follows:

1. Plausibly, evolution would lead creatures like us to have built-in basic desires for health, accomplishment, friendship, pleasure, knowledge, and aesthetic experience.

2. The basic goods (health, accomplishment, etc.) are objective, partly nonnatural values.

3. Evolution cannot get us in touch with nonnatural facts. So,

4. It is unlikely that unaided evolution would explain why humans have basic desires for health, etc. (from 1-3).

5. God's guidance would explain how evolution led us to have desires for the basic goods. So,

6. It is likely that God exists (from 4-5, using inference to the best explanation).

So, Lauinger's preferred theory of well-being, the desire-perfectionist theory, supports theism since according to his theory humans do have built-in stable desires for objective, partly non-natural, perfectionist goods.

I want to raise two problems for this argument. First, the desire-fulfillment theory that I outlined above seems roughly as plausible as the desire-perfectionist theory (since they are each as dialectically stable as the other), but premise (2) above is not supported by the desire-fulfillment theory. The desire-fulfillment theory I outlined stays entirely neutral about whether the objects of basic human desires are objective goods; the well-being of humans does not depend on the objectivity of these goods, according to this theory. So, there is a roughly equally plausible alternative theory of well-being that does not support theism. We don't have a good argument for theism on the basis of well-being until we have some reason to think that the desire-perfectionism theory is better than the desire-fulfillment theory outlined above.

Second, there is an explanation of how evolution can get in touch with nonnatural facts. Erik Wielenberg's (2009) non-natural, non-theistic moral realism can be used to illustrate how. On his view, there are substantive, metaphysically necessary, brute ethical facts, e.g., that pain is intrinsically bad. Let us imagine that Lauinger's perfectionist goods are also necessarily good. Now, Lauinger grants that evolution can explain why humans would have built-in stable desires for health, accomplishment, etc. These things are necessarily good (we are imagining), and their goodness is non-natural and necessarily supervenes on the natural properties of health, accomplishment, etc. We now have an explanation for how evolution connects our desires to objective non-natural goods: desires for certain natural properties are selected for and goodness necessarily supervenes on these natural properties. This view may face a different problem: once we realize that evolution explains our basic desires, what reason do we have to think that it has hooked us up with the objective goods? Lacking such a reason, perhaps we should be skeptical that our basic desires are for objective goods. Richard Joyce (2006) and Sharon Street (2006) have defended arguments of this sort. But, Lauinger's argument is not of this sort; his is a metaphysical argument, not an epistemological argument, and Wielenberg's view indicates that premise (3) of his argument is false.

Despite the problems I have raised for Lauinger's arguments, there is much to be praised in his book. His careful discussion of the various problems for theories of well-being is very well done and will be an excellent overview and resource for scholars and students. His defense of the desire-perfectionism theory contains fascinating, empirically-informed discussions of the structure of desires had by people with depression, eating disorders, autism, and other conditions. Finally, his work should also encourage deeper reflection on new ways of connecting ethics to God.


Joyce, Richard, The Evolution of Morality, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press (2006).

Street, Sharon, "A Darwinian Dilemma for Realist Theories of Value," Philosophical Studies 127 (2006): 109-166.

Wielenberg, Erik J., "In Defense of Non-Natural, Non-Theistic Moral Realism," Faith and Philosophy 26.1 (2009): 23-41.