Well-Being: Happiness in a Worthwhile Life

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Neera K. Badhwar, Well-Being: Happiness in a Worthwhile Life, Oxford University Press, 2014, 264pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195323276.

Reviewed by Jean Kazez, Southern Methodist University


Must we be good to live good lives, as many ancient philosophers believed? It's an attractive idea. If that were so, we could answer the question "Why be moral?" We could also think that bad people automatically receive their just deserts to the extent that being bad makes their lives worse for them as well as for others. Unfortunately, though, the arguments of the ancients aren't entirely convincing. One can't help but wonder whether personal well-being is really bound up with moral virtue or, rather, this is just a beautiful idea, or a product of wishful thinking, or a remnant of Greek high-mindedness.

Neera Badhwar aims to make a compelling case that personal well-being -- the highest prudential good, as she calls it -- does require moral virtue. The core of her book is a direct argument for that view, and throughout she tries to address various doubts one might have. The result is sometimes more convincing, sometimes less, but consistently engaging, colorful, and intricately argued.

Chapter 1 identifies the book's position as Aristotelian in spirit and aligned with objective theories of the highest prudential good. A good life must be objectively worthwhile, but Badhwar isn't going to offer a simple objective list theory. If moral virtue were merely on one line of a long list of life goods, she argues, it would be impossible to say why it especially contributes to well-being or contributes much at all, compared to the other items on the list. We need a foundation for saying it's fundamental and central. Chapter 2 clarifies and defends some of the Aristotelian underpinnings of the project. She embraces Aristotle's conception of well-being as choiceworthy, as stable, and as a complete and final good that lacks nothing. But we don't have to follow Aristotle in all matters; for example, we should part company with him when he says that the philosophical life is the very best human life.

Chapter 3 makes many compelling arguments against subjective accounts of well-being. For example, Badhwar contends that desire satisfaction theorists implicitly recognize objective values to the extent that they think satisfied desires make people better off only when their owners are autonomous, well-informed, reflective, and the like. In chapter 4, she makes her main argument for moral virtue as a requirement ("eudaimonism" for short). With that job done, she goes on to try to make eudaimonism even more attractive in chapters 5 through 8. More on those later chapters after looking closely at chapter 4.

Badhwar's argumentative strategy is to start with an idea about personal well-being that she expects to be more appealing, initially, than the idea that well-being requires moral virtue. Her starting point is that personal well-being requires autonomy. The plan, then, is to show that the autonomous person's autonomy must make him morally virtuous. So if autonomy is required for well-being, so is moral virtue.

A lot here turns on what exactly autonomy is. At the beginning of chapter 4, Badhwar initially characterizes autonomy quite intuitively and commonsensically -- basically as self-governance. The autonomous person is his own man, her own woman. He has his own point of view, his own identity. Also intuitive is Badhwar's characterization of autonomy in substantive as opposed to content-neutral terms. On the content-neutral conception, a person would possess autonomy throughout a period of time, even if she made an autonomous decision to become someone's slave on the first day and slaved away thereafter, and even if she gradually became increasingly dependent and servile. Such a person would surely not live the best human life, Badhwar argues, and so the conception of autonomy we need is substantive.

Badhwar opts for the idea that autonomy is a character trait, an epistemic and deliberative virtue. The autonomous person is "intellectually and emotionally disposed to track truth or understanding in important areas of her life as a human being and individual, and to act accordingly" (p. 86). What's most crucial here for the overall argument is the part about tracking truth, which will become the bridge to moral virtue. About that, more in a moment, but first, what about regarding autonomy as a disposition to track truth and a disposition to act accordingly?

This strikes me as much too weak to capture the sort of autonomy that's required for the highest prudential good -- the best life. Take Solomon Northup, the man whose life is depicted in the autobiography and later the movie Twelve Years a Slave. A free man in his thirties at the outset, with deeply ingrained character traits, he seems to retain the virtue of autonomy, as defined by Badhwar, even as he is forced into slavery. He is disposed to track truth and to act accordingly, even as he loses all control over the course of his life. To my mind, he lacks aspects of autonomy that are critical for even so much as a good life, let alone the best life. The autonomy that's needed for the good/best life includes not merely a disposition, but actual self-governance -- actually running your own life from your own beliefs, values, preferences, and so on. It's an inner state, but an outer state as well.

Turning now to truth-tracking, there are two questions: is that really an element of autonomy, and insofar as we have it, must we have moral virtue? Autonomy, according to Badhwar, is the virtue of seeking truth and seeking to live your life on the basis of truth. If you have that character trait, you will be "reality-oriented," on her view. Being reality-oriented is not the same as successfully gaining truths, she points out: "reality-orientation does not guarantee success in achieving truth or understanding -- indeed, being reality-oriented is compatible with being quite mistaken about important facts" (p. 95). When we are autonomous, reality-oriented, and in possession of knowledge in some important area, then we have one more asset -- "realism," as Badhwar often calls it. The realist actually gains truths and lives in accordance with them.

It's important to Badhwar to show that truth-seeking is part of autonomy, because autonomy seems so manifestly a requirement for well-being. If truth-seeking is "inside" autonomy, and moral virtue is "inside" truth-seeking, like nested Russian dolls, then if autonomy is needed for well-being, so is moral virtue -- just less obviously so. But neither of these "inside" claims is wholly convincing. I am not convinced that autonomy always, by definition, involves truth-orientation or realism. The person who says "I just know the immunization caused my son's autism," and so campaigns against vaccination, scores low on realism but not particularly on autonomy. Many people who seem to live perfectly good, autonomous lives base their lives on many "I just know that"s.

Setting that aside, what if autonomy does bring reality-orientation along with it, or realism (when truth-seeking goes well)? Does that insure that the autonomous person has moral virtue? I expected a case to be made at length, but there are only a few pages devoted to this step of the argument (section 4.7 and a few other passages in other chapters). Realism, Badhwar says, "entails a life of the central virtues" (p. 25). Using a formulation she repeats several times, she says, of a realist, "to the extent that he is realistic, he is virtuous" (p. 98). Why would this be true? The idea seems to be that part of what we are realistic about, if we are realistic, is a realm of values; and when we are autonomous and realistic, we act in accordance with the truths -- including the normative truths -- we are realistic about.

As an example, Badhwar points to Antigone and Haemon standing up to Creon and insisting on burial rites for Polyneices, thereby evincing "not only their autonomy/reality-orientation, but also their realism: their correct understanding of the situation and the values involved" (p. 109). The example is helpful, but leaves me somewhat puzzled. Since moral virtue is a set of intellectual and emotional dispositions, according to the neo-Aristotelian account of virtue in Chapter 6, how could it be true that a person is virtuous literally "to the extent that" she is realistic? Even if there is a realism-virtue link, couldn't a person be very realistic and therefore insightful about values, but lacking in the emotions that are needed to motivate compliance with those values? In fact, this seems to happen all the time: I can see what generosity dictates, but I can't always bring myself to do the generous thing.

Despite all these worries and complaints, there's something right about the idea that a good life requires autonomy, and perhaps autonomy does have at least some tendency to bring along with it both reality-orientation and realism; and realism has some tendency to bring along with it moral virtue. That's enough to validate the thought that people with well-being do tend to have moral virtue. But it's not enough to let us say, definitively, "well-being requires moral virtue." And that is what was supposed to have been proven.

After chapter 4, there are many more efforts to make eudaimonism attractive, and they are often successful. It would be a problem for Badhwar if the realism that (on her account) makes us virtuous also made us unhappy. Some positive psychologists allege there is such a thing as being too realistic for your own good; Badhwar finds fault with their research in chapter 5. Chapter 6 addresses a doubt about eudaimonism to the effect that it makes good lives too rare, considering that most people are virtuous in some circumstances but vicious in other -- they have mixed lives. Badhwar argues that it's perfectly coherent to think of virtue as domain-specific, as opposed to necessarily global; and that we needn't and shouldn't go even further and see virtues as specific to just one situation; virtue isn't completely fragmented.

Chapter 7 takes on the Stoic claim that virtue is not just one requirement for personal well-being, but the only requirement. Badhwar effectively elucidates how it could be true that virtue has primacy without rendering external goods completely unnecessary and also effectively debunks the myth of the person who has all the subjective well-being you could want, but no virtue.

Chapter 8 sums up and takes stock. To have well-being, one must be

realistic, that is, reality-oriented/autonomous, and in touch with the important facts of one's own life and human life in general. In turn, to the extent that we live realistically, we live virtuously. This makes realism both a prudential value and a moral value, bridging the alleged conceptual gap between the prudential and the moral. (p. 222)

By the end of the book I was still worried that there is some gap between the prudential and the moral because the links Badhwar sees between autonomy and realism, and between realism and virtue, are not as tight as one might wish. I nevertheless enjoyed and learned a great deal from this book.