Weltschmerz: Pessimism in German Philosophy, 1860-190

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Frederick C. Beiser, Weltschmerz: Pessimism in German Philosophy, 1860-1900, Oxford University Press, 2016, 301 pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198768715.

Reviewed by Sandra Shapshay, Indiana University-Bloomington


It is well known that Schopenhauer's philosophy -- especially the pessimistic, resignationist strand thereof -- prompted Nietzsche to undertake a "justification" of life as an aesthetic phenomenon in the Birth of Tragedy, and an "affirmation" of life in many other works. It is not well known, however, especially in the Anglo-American philosophical world, that Schopenhauer's generally pessimistic take on the value of human existence sparked an entire controversy in Germany, the "Pessimism Controversy" in the second half of the 19th century. Or I should say, it has not been well known until now . . . with the publication of Frederick Beiser's ground-breaking book.

Beiser seeks to correct what he sees, in my view correctly, as the dominant narrative of nineteenth-century German philosophy, one made canonical by Karl Löwith's Von Hegel zu Nietzsche (1949). Due to the reception of Löwith's book, the traditional story is one of political revolution and increasing freedom from religious authority. The main players then are Hegel, Marx, Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. Into this narrative, Schopenhauer simply does not fit. And even in his own time, he was regarded as a philosophical oddball, an outlier. But Beiser reminds us that after his death, "Arthur Schopenhauer [became] the most famous and influential philosopher in Germany from 1860 until the First World War." (p. 13). How on earth did this happen? The dominant narrative really does not explain this fact.

In elegantly written, lucid prose, Beiser does a great service by correcting Löwith's one-sided narrative and rehabilitating the important role that Schopenhauer played in this period. In Chapter 1, Beiser reconstructs the influence that he had on the direction of Neo-Kantianism and positivism, arguing that Schopenhauer's focus on questions of the meaning and value of human existence played a role in the "identity crisis of philosophy," and spurred some Neo-Kantians to take up a study of human values broadly construed. The growing popularity of Schopenhauer's work and the fact that it hewed closely to philosophy's traditional vocation thus accounts in large part, according to Beiser, for the "practical turn" in Neo-Kantianism.

But the focus of the majority of chapters is on another Schopenhauerian legacy, namely, the aforementioned "Pessimism Controversy." As Beiser sees it, the philosophical problem of pessimism in the late 19th c. in Germany has to do with the thesis that "life is not worth living, that nothingness is better than being, or that it is worse to be than not be." (p. 4). And while this thesis has roots in ancient thought (cf. Sophocles' Oedipus at Kolonos), Beiser argues compellingly that it survives in the theological problem of evil, and presents itself -- in a post-Death-of-God climate -- as the question of the meaning and value of life. In other words, the problem of evil and suffering in a post-Christian world "impugned no longer the existence of God but the value of existence itself" (7).

The chapters on Frauenstädt and Dühring reveal some good early criticisms of Schopenhauer's metaphysics and resignationist ethics, as well as interesting attempts at revising Schopenhauer's system along Hegelian and quasi-religious lines, respectively. The chapter on Hartmann is fascinating (albeit morally repugnant to this liberal-egalitarian) and reconstructs his conservative, elitist brand of eudemonic pessimism and evolutionary optimism. In a nutshell, Hartmann argues that we should give up on trying to improve the lot of the masses, for such eudemonic improvement is hopeless, but the elite may nonetheless justify their existence by their role in cultural and historical development, a development that is only possible on the basis of social inequality.

In chapters on Mainländer and Bahnsen, Beiser continues to draw out hitherto unknown twists and turns in the pessimism controversy from the primary sources, most of which have not been translated. Beiser's reconstruction in these chapters of this narrative trajectory in the late 19th century is quite illuminating.

My worries about the book relate to the way that Beiser is approaching Schopenhauer. In his effort to correct the one-sided, traditional Löwith narrative, he reads and interprets Schopenhauer not for his own sake -- and for the sake of what we can still learn from him today -- but as the thinker who spawned the "Pessimism Controversy." In doing so, Beiser offers us a picture of Schopenhauer as arch-pessimist. This picture is already quite standard outside of scholarly Schopenhauer circles, but it is ultimately reductive, distorting, and by now has grown somewhat tedious and shallow as a view of Schopenhauer's thought.

Beiser states that "ultimately, Schopenhauer's question is more practical than theoretical, more ethical than metaphysical. His puzzle of existence is what we might call 'the Hamlet question': 'To be or not to be?'" (p. 16). To support this view of Schopenhauer's central question, he offers a citation to a supplementary chapter (in WWR II) as Schopenhauer's "best statement of this problem." Yet, the "puzzle of existence" that really exercises Schopenhauer in the main volume, WWR I, and especially in the pivotal Book II of that volume where he attempts to fathom the other side of the "world as representation," is not a practical or ethical question about the value of existence. It is rather the metaphysical question of the Kantian thing-in-itself, and the epistemological question of how we can know something about it. To my mind, it is precisely because Schopenhauer embraces transcendental idealism, but grapples further with the question of what the world is "in itself" -- namely, "will" -- that he sees himself as the "sole true heir" to Kant; the question of the value of existence is important, but secondary, to the question of what the world ultimately is.

So, while it is true that in Book IV of WWR especially, Schopenhauer treats the pessimistic facets of human life that he sees as intimately bound up with the "world as will" -- for example, that endless, purposeless striving is the basic default for all living beings, and that this entails a great deal of suffering -- the previous books of WWR I are predominantly concerned with metaphysical and epistemological questions: What is the structure of ordinary empirical consciousness? What can we know about the in-itself of the world through introspection on our own bodies? What can we learn about the essential features of the world from aesthetic experience of nature, works of art, and from music? Additionally, much of Schopenhauer's works are taken up with not-so-pessimistic reflections on questions such as: What makes for a genuinely morally worthy action? How should human beings treat non-human animals? How might we still be transcendentally free despite living in a world of representation governed by the principle of sufficient reason? What is a just state? Why does music seem more powerful than the other arts?

In sum, I take issue with Beiser's characterization of Schopenhauer's central question as Hamlet's, for while it is largely the pessimistic Schopenhauer that caught the attention of late 19th c. German philosophers, I believe he overstates the case that the "value of existence" question is really Schopenhauer's central question.

Another worry I have about Beiser's interpretation and reconstruction of Schopenhauer in chapters 1-3 is that sometimes he characterizes Schopenhauer as a sort of pre-Kantian, foundationalist metaphysician, writing, for instance, that:

Fundamental aspects of Schopenhauer's philosophy -- his pessimism and ethics -- depend on his metaphysics. His pessimism holds that life is suffering because it is the product of an insatiable and incessant cosmic will; and his ethics holds that we achieve redemption only when we recognize our identity with all other things. (p. 26).

This characterization makes Schopenhauer sound like a foundationalist thinker akin to Spinoza, Leibniz or Wolff. Yet, Schopenhauer's method is more empirical and coherentist. For him, the "key" to deciphering the "riddle" of the world consists in "combining at the right place outer experience with inner, and making the latter the key to the former" (WWR II: 181, Payne translation), but confirmation that one has deciphered the world of phenomena correctly comes from the fact that one is able to "perceive agreement and consistency in the contrasting confusion of the phenomena of this world" (WWR II: 185, Payne translation). His method is more a back-and-forth between experience and a metaphysical interpretation thereof, rather than a top-down metaphysical approach, as Beiser suggests.

At other points in the book, however, Beiser does describe Schopenhauer as an immanent metaphysician, "one that remains strictly within the limits of possible experience" (p. 27), and who does not really claim that the transcendent Kantian thing in itself is 'will' but rather that the thing in itself is "simply the content or essence of appearances" (p. 29). This follows Julian Young and John Atwell's deflationary interpretations of Schopenhauer's metaphysics.

One of the main problems with these deflationary interpretations, however, is that Schopenhauer's metaphysical monism seems to rely precisely on the idea that the thing-in-itself must be non-spatiotemporal because it is transcendent. Thus, he talks of "thing-in-itself" rather than "things-in-themselves". On this, Schopenhauer thinks he is being truer to Kantian notions than was Kant himself. Other rather transcendently metaphysical aspects of Schopenhauer's thought, which Beiser recognizes, are the Platonic Ideas, and the notion of the "intelligible character," which he calls a "special Idea" for each person. In Book II of WWR I, Schopenhauer describes these Ideas as Willensakte (acts of the Will). All of this seems to suggest, contra Young, Atwell and Beiser that Schopenhauer is really working with a transcendent notion of the thing-in-itself.

Beiser acknowledges in the Preface that he is only offering an introductory exegesis and reconstruction of Schopenhauer's thought that does not engage seriously with the secondary literature. So, it would not be fair for me to expect him to give a very scholarly interpretation of Schopenhauer in a book that is largely about Schopenhauer's influence on later thinkers. Yet, Beiser wants to have it both ways, for he does dip his toe into scholarly debates, chiding commentators like Hamlyn, Janaway and Magee (see notes on p. 28 and 32) for favoring the former transcendently-metaphysical interpretation over Young and Atwell's more deflationary interpretation. But I don't think that Beiser should be able to have it both ways: either he should seriously engage with these debates or he should not have been in the business of chiding Schopenhauer commentators.

Chapters 3 and 4, on Schopenhauer's pessimism, are more successful at providing a coherent, scholarly exegesis, but there are problems here as well, namely, that Beiser ignores Schopenhauer's embrace of transcendental freedom and pays insufficient attention to the tensions between his ethics of compassion and his doctrine of renunciation.

To belabor these criticisms, though, would obscure the fact that Beiser has made an important contribution to our understanding of nineteenth-century German philosophy that should be required reading of anyone who seeks to understand the full story of the German philosophical tradition in this century. It paints a detailed, rich, fascinating picture of a hitherto forgotten controversy, and one that deals with issues of value and meaning in life that touch us all.