Werner Herzog: Filmmaker and Philosopher

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Richard Eldridge, Werner Herzog: Filmmaker and Philosopher, Bloomsbury, 2019, 221pp., $88.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350091672.

Reviewed by Christopher Hamilton, King's College London


Werner Herzog is a major contemporary filmmaker who has produced a body of work of real importance. In this book, Richard Eldridge seeks to take Herzog seriously in philosophical terms. His approach is to read Herzog as exploring ways of finding meaning in what Adorno -- though Eldridge doesn't mention him -- calls our 'administered society'. After an introductory chapter in which he describes our world of 'education reduced to the development of skills needed by docile and reliable workers, ideological conceptions of freedom as escape and rich hedonistic consumption in the private sphere, empty clichés about the value of choice' (p.10), he suggests that 'poetic visions are needed in order to disclose possibilities of significance in life within the framework of contemporary industrial-commercial culture' (p.35).

There follow three themed chapters -- nature, selfhood and history -- and in all three Eldridge follows a pattern, that of introducing some thoughts from philosophers on the theme in question, and then exploring that theme in the context of Herzog's work. The exploration largely takes the form of description, one after the other, of those of Herzog's films that Eldridge takes to be most relevant to the theme in question, with some interpretative remarks. It's a risky strategy because it becomes at times rather list-like, and, further, Eldridge doesn't integrate well the opening remarks in each chapter on philosophers into the comments he makes on Herzog's films, leaving it unclear just what the purpose was of mentioning the philosophers in the first place. For example, Nietzsche's conception of nature is introduced in Chapter 2, and Eldridge goes on to say that Herzog also has a vision of nature such as we find in Nietzsche -- utterly indifferent to man, 'implacably hostile . . . [and] moved by incomprehensible forces' (p.57), devoid of any providence (p.54), and so on. The question then becomes how we can find meaning in such a world, even experience moments of child-like absorption in it (p.63). But once Nietzsche is mentioned, he is pretty much left behind, and Eldridge doesn't show how his work is deepened by what Herzog offers, nor how it might better help us understand that offering. We're just left with a sense of two men thinking in different media (philosophy, film) about pretty much the same thing from a similar point of view.

This pattern is repeated in Chapter 3 in the context of the idea, largely drawn from some thoughts from Hegel, that, as Eldridge glosses it, 'Even healthy psychic and practical life is surrounded by fantasy and at least tendencies to both vengeful narcissism and despair, as one lives . . . with a sense of selfhood unexpressed and of social normalization as victimization' (p.111). Eldridge reads Herzog's films as seeking to find better ways for selfhood to be expressed. Chapter 4 then deals with Herzog's conception of history and politics, canvassing at the outset various objections to his work -- that he seeks to take a metapolitical stance, ignoring the political realities of war, exploitation, etc., through aestheticizing suffering and so on -- and going on to argue that, although there is some plausibility in these charges, Herzog is, after all, worried about the barbarism that lies just beneath the surface of civilisation (pp.173ff.), together with the flattening of cultural differences to 'the American commercial model' (p.176). Referring to Walter Benjamin, Eldridge says that Herzog's interest is in finding in history 'Resources for transfigurative present orientation . . . by arranging materials from the past in order to produce a punctual, monadic image that might move one abruptly into greater responsiveness to one's world and increased possibilities of more significant action now' (p.181). The three themed chapters therefore rehearse pretty much the same worry in different, but related, contexts, which means that Eldridge reads Herzog's films very much as variations on a theme: modern, late capitalist life is conformist, stultifying, shallow, but here, in such and such a person, we see in Herzog's films someone who is living with the full dynamic energy of the self -- be it in adventure or submitting nobly to suffering, etc. -- and thus has found meaning in an otherwise meaningless world. This has the unfortunate effect of interpreting the films as saying largely the same thing.

I shall come to some points of detail in Eldridge's discussion of certain of the films, but it is significant to note that his approach leaves hanging a major theme he introduces at the outset. There he contrasts philosophy, which 'seeks fixed doctrines and doxa' (p.14), with the arts, including film, which

present at best incomplete and uncertain intimations of possibilities of fuller life, while ending in cadences and forms of closure that involve only temporary and temporalized diminishings of a sense of outsiderliness and anxiety. To pursue or insist on stronger, doctrinal conclusions is the time- and finitude-denying path of narcissism and madness. (p.14)

So one might have expected in the rest of the book a critique of a certain conception of philosophy as a form of narcissism and madness, using the films of Herzog to develop that critique. That philosophy displays the obsessions -- or, at any rate, something like them -- that Eldridge mentions is central to, e.g., Stanley Cavell's work (and the theme is there, of course, in Nietzsche and others), but Eldridge drops the topic once it has been mentioned and so does nothing to explain how art generally, or the films of Herzog in particular, could help ease philosophy's neurotic self-understanding.

In Chapter 2, Eldridge tells us that Herzog's The White Diamond -- a little known film, but one his most successful, in Eldridge's view -- 'does a great deal to fill in what worthwhile human action might look like, even while accepting the transitoriness of human life in nature' (p.89). The relevant discussion is given in Chapter 3 (pp.160-1), but what we learn there is that we need to try to confront the chaos of life by seeking to realise our dreams, perhaps by releasing ourselves into a state of calm and peace, central to which is the cultivation of an openness to 'perceptual experiences of astonishment and admiration at the unfolding of the world in time' (p.161). This is all well and good, but it hovers somewhere uncomfortably in the region of cliché or platitude because it is the kind of advice that only really makes sense in face of individual experience of life, or in art which can bring it alive for us. Eldridge makes an attempt to open our eyes to the possibility of Herzog's bringing it alive for us in the film in question, but here, as elsewhere, his account remains largely descriptive, and so, in my judgement, he fails to give a vivid sense of how the film can do this.

It is, of course, staggeringly difficult to do what I am suggesting Eldridge doesn't manage to do here. The very best critics can do it and the rest of us have to try to catch up. But I do think that Eldridge could have helped himself a bit more.

It's peculiar, for example, that, when discussing The Enigma of Kaspar Hauser, no reference is made to Truffaut's L'enfant sauvage, the comparison with which might have enabled one to draw out some helpful reflections on, e.g., the role of language in Herzog's film. Again, Aguirre: the Wrath of God cries out for comparison with Conrad's Heart of Darkness. After all, getting clear on the distinctive achievements and failures of specific works of art is helped enormously by comparison between different works. Further, Eldridge does nothing but note (p.133) that one can find influences on Herzog's Even Dwarfs Started Small in Antonioni's cinematography and in Tod Browning's use of dwarfs in his Freaks: he doesn't pursue the thought. And when he compares Aguirre, Nietzsche's 'highest human being' and Homer's Achilles, he comments that without 'widespread, lived acceptance of either Christian metaphysics, with its morality of benevolence and charity, or something of comparable force, we are likely to resonate somewhat to the attractions of naked will and power, while also feeling dismay and horror' (p.135). Yet much more needs to be said about our response here: apart from anything else, it is hard to see quite what the relation between acceptance of Christian metaphysics and morality and the horrified thrill in question is, since some of those most subject to that thrill have been Christians. The thought is left hanging.

Perhaps the strangest omission is that Eldridge makes nothing of the fact that Herzog's 1979 film Nosferatu is a remake of Murnau's 1922 film of that title. It would have been extremely interesting to see what can be made of the comparison, not least since Herzog's film has been judged -- for example, by Gilberto Perez in his book The Material Ghost -- to be inferior to the original, e.g., in its cinematic understanding and presentation of death. Perez may be right or wrong, but it is odd not to see this kind of issue broached in the case of a remake.

At times, Eldridge doesn't, in my view, put enough pressure on Herzog. For example, the Kaspar Hauser film is deeply moving, but it is also in many ways sentimental, offering a rather clichéd vision of man's relation to nature and to civilisation. Yet Eldridge's discussion (pp.136-9) doesn't pick up on the sentimentality at all: Eldridge seems to accept a highly contentious conception of nature when he speaks of Kaspar's 'natural intelligence that the public world is ill-prepared to understand or accept' (p.137). For, whatever Kaspar's intelligence is, it is in part the product of the civilisation into which he is introduced when released from his cellar, so the fault line between it and that civilisation cannot be traced as neatly as Eldridge (or Herzog) seems to want to. Certainly the film does not wholly capitulate to sentimentality, but that just shows that Herzog is struggling with it here. It is, in my view, a mark of the greatness of this film that it is flawed by its sentimentality, yet Eldridge, whilst acknowledging that some of Herzog's films are unsuccessful, does not seem to see that a certain kind of failure in many of Herzog's films is knit up into their greatness -- or, if the notion of greatness seems too strong, at least whatever it is in them that makes them deeply worthwhile as objects of interest and study.

One of those things is, in my view, Herzog's capacity to choose images that give one a sense of the irredeemable carelessness of human beings. One such scene is, I think, that of the dancing chicken at the end of Stroszek: a chicken is enclosed in a miserable plastic and glass box in a tawdry amusement arcade; it has been trained, when coins are inserted into the slot, to press a machine that emits a mind-numbing sound, then overlaid with, as Eldridge says, the noise of a 'manic celebratory harmonica' (p.143), to which the it 'dances'. Eldridge reads this as an image of Stroszek's wretched life:

The sequence suggests that we share a bizarre automatism with animal life that is both natural . . . and coerced . . . Like the chicken, Stroszek has done what it is in him to do in the natural and cultural circumstances in which he has somehow found himself. The manic celebratory harmonica suggests meaning, at least to an observer of Stroszek's life and viewer of the film, but tells us nothing about what it might be. Somehow music might inform natural and social life, but perhaps at best intermittently, without evident purpose, especially in a cruel commercial world. (pp.142-3)

I am sure that there is a parallel between Stroszek's life and that of the chicken. But, aside from the fact that I am at a loss to understand how it is that Eldridge can suppose that the inane sound of the harmonica (especially when heard over the racket of sounds to which the chicken is dancing) can have anything to do with giving things meaning, I think he misses the key point here: this scene gives one a sense of humanity's absolute, implacable desire to do the dirt on life, to evacuate it of anything gentle, subtle, decent, generous or hospitable. This is partly a matter of their treating other animals with such barbarity, as if they were mere fodder to serve the human desire for the lowest kind of entertainment, and partly a matter of the crudity and vulgarity of the whole amusement arcade itself. There is a kind of vision here of human beings as a monstrous polluting presence in existence. It is a vision of humanity as deserving nothing but contempt. There can be little doubt, in my view, that this is something that is present in Herzog's work, jostling for space with a sense of the possibility of glimpsing, rarely, something redemptive, a long way off, over the horizon. Indeed, such a glimpse is afforded by some of those in his films who radiate a 'radical dignity' (p.147) on account of the suffering they have passed through.

Similarly, Herzog's redemptive vision is often mediated by outsiders who are in various ways obsessive in the pursuit of some noble (or mad) goal, filled with a sense of destiny, always in search of 'ecstatic truth' (p.45). He has no interest in how we might find meaning in 'Happy marriages, friendships, fulfilling work, and accomplished, reasonable, more or less normal social identities' (p.73). But if such outsiders are in some way to help us 'to live fully as actively intelligent and emotionally responsive agents' (p.45), and this is Herzog's aim (or one of them) in making these films, then it is clear that it is simply a non-starter for most of us actually to live as they do, as Eldridge notes (p.209). Anat Pick makes some such point even more sharply, arguing in her Creaturely Poetics that Herzog explores in his films the unravelling of human beings in extreme or limit situations, where they begin to lose the traditional markers of personhood (reason, language, free will, etc.), and, in arguing this, she offers a pointed challenge to Eldridge who, it seems, is reading Herzog in a diametrically opposed way, as if Herzog were providing pointers to a greater, not lesser, sense of selfhood: he is aware, of course, of Herzog's sense of the 'fragility of human life within the chaos of nature' (p.173), but sees the outsider figures as preserving their humanity in the face of such. It would have been good to see Eldridge engage with Pick's interpretation.

It's clear that Eldridge has an acute sense of Herzog's films as giving us something that can help us make better sense of our humdrum lives. But how we can incorporate into our own lives something of the spirit in which Herzog's outsiders live remains unclear. Eldridge's book raises the issue acutely, and for that one is grateful, but it leaves one with a sense of much more still to be said.