What a Philosopher Is: Becoming Nietzsche

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Laurence Lampert, What a Philosopher Is: Becoming Nietzsche, University of Chicago Press, 2017, 349pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226488110.

Reviewed by Joel E. Mann, St. Norbert College


Laurence Lampert's ambition is to trace the arc of Nietzsche's becoming Nietzsche. This might appear yet another stab at literary biography, but, since Nietzsche considered himself (among other things) a philosopher, it cannot be reduced to such. That is, what Nietzsche thought a philosopher ought to be, which is inseparable from the question of what philosophy is, matters. How a great philosopher understood his task is of the utmost historical importance, surely, but it is also of import for the business of philosophy itself, since philosophers themselves wear their own methodological self-awareness as a badge of honor.

All of the above is perhaps especially true in Nietzsche's case, as scholars and enthusiasts will be well aware. Nietzsche was keenly concerned about the nature of philosophy and its relation to other peculiarly human endeavors -- culture, politics, art, science, and religion most prominently. Thanks to his unique (and uniquely beguiling) literary style, Nietzsche's views on this subject -- like many of his views -- are not readily transparent. Thus, tracing Nietzsche's development as a philosopher requires us to engage in the interpretive project of understanding his philosophy of philosophy, as it were, along with his philosophy of knowledge, philosophy of value, and so on. Lampert's project, then, includes two dependent but distinct subordinate objectives, one literary-biographical, the other philosophical-interpretive. To foreshadow my final assessment: the book often succeeds as far as it can at the first while largely failing at the second.

Somewhat ironically, Lampert maintains that Nietzsche's fundamental philosophical views did not change substantially over the course of his relatively short but frantically productive career. To start off his "unitarian" story, Lampert tattoos Nietzsche with the post-modern skepticism about knowledge, reality, and value often read into the early unpublished tract On Truth and Lie in the Extra-moral Sense (see especially 44-59). In so doing, Lampert inherits the considerable burden of formulating responses to the obvious objections. Why didn't Nietzsche publish On Truth and Lie? What was his objective in publishing all those other books that seem to contradict it? In what ways did he evolve as a philosopher, if indeed his views on knowledge, reality, and value did not?

Given the challenges Lampert faces, it's hardly surprising that he structures the book around three "inflection points." Part 1 takes on Nietzsche's Untimely Meditations, written in the wake of On Truth and Lie; Part 2, Human, All-too-human, which Nietzsche himself identified as a major change of philosophical heart; and Part 3, the addition of Sanctus Januarius to The Gay Science as its fourth and final part. These three texts represent, in order, the three phases ("early," "middle," and "late") sometimes ascribed to Nietzsche's thought. Lampert must explain these apparent phases not as changes in Nietzsche's fundamental philosophical views, but as changes in his views about the context and consequences of those views, as well, perhaps, as Nietzsche's own psychological relation to them.

It is this last mode of explanation that Lampert chiefly exploits, and with some justification. Later in his career, Nietzsche strongly considered destroying extant copies of Human, All Too Human (HH) on the grounds that, according to Lampert, it "hid his corrosive suspicion and his difference of perspective behind something alien, even opposite, to him, the optimism of the modern Enlightenment" (7). That is, Nietzsche's dissatisfaction with HH was not just that it endorsed views he no longer held, but that it grossly misrepresented and obscured the views he actually held at the time of its writing. Bizarrely, he sought to replace it with a "new" version, the book that would eventually be published under the title Beyond Good and Evil. As Lampert carefully lays out (3-13), Nietzsche eventually settled instead for a less radical retraction: the series of self-critical prefaces tacked to previous works. Lampert deserves credit for shining a light on this fascinating episode in Nietzsche's literary life; probably too few commentators take it into account. But there is always danger in taking Nietzsche at his word. His ultimate embarrassment by HH is a reason for taking his own story of its genesis and importance with a grain of salt, and one often feels that Lampert could and should be more circumspect.

Still, I find the book most engaging when it lets Nietzsche speak to us about his oeuvre through these prefaces, as well as his letters and unpublished notebook entries. Lampert's account of Nietzsche's travels, personal relationships, and health problems in the "hibernation" period prior to HH is sympathetic and at times moving (127-41). The picayune publication details of Nietzsche's planned works are turned into entertaining stories of absurd obsession and artistic brilliance (5-13; 67-9; 155-58; and 205-18, among others). Undoubtedly, Lampert's gift lies in his ability to give close, lively readings between the lines of Nietzsche's work both published and unpublished. His explication of the first 15 sections of The Birth of Tragedy (19-42) and the end of Sanctus Januarius (chapter 13) especially repay attention.

Despite the flashes of historical fastidiousness, literary sensitivity, and psychological perspicacity, however, I remain unconvinced by Lampert's central (and often difficult to detect) thesis, namely, that Nietzsche understands the role of a philosopher, and thus his own philosophical project, as "defining how a whole community should live" (1) by harnessing religious impulses in the service of new insights into life and value (334-35). Perhaps not surprisingly, the entire book has a discernibly (if restrained) Straussian and Heideggerean cast. Whether this is a shortcoming or a selling point will depend on the reader's taste, I suppose, and that seems to be just what Lampert intends. These interpretive positions and their constitutive theses -- a metaphysical read of the will to power, for example, or an emphatically political spin on Nietzsche's obsession with genius -- are rarely argued for. They are largely assumed, and if we don't share the assumptions, well, then, so much the worse for us.

To wit, Lampert rarely wades into the scholarly debate over Nietzsche's philosophical development, as evident from his failure to situate himself against a backdrop of competing views on Nietzsche. His bibliography is amply populated by literary and biographical studies, but considerable stretches of this book go by without reference to the philosophical-interpretive views of others. Moreover, Lampert's footnotes serve largely as allusions to work that supports, whether directly or indirectly, his own view. In this sense, then, the project, whatever its charms, is simply not a scholarly one.

The lack of scholarly scruple infects the project at many levels. There is, first and foremost, a failure to appreciate and grapple with key philosophical problems. For example, Lampert never works out the precise nature of Nietzsche's epistemology, though this is key to his unitarian interpretation. He fixates on Nietzsche's own retrospective description of his epistemological commitments as "skepticism, dissolution, and pessimism" (44ff.) and stresses their importance to Nietzsche's larger cultural critique. But he never adequately attends to the nuts and bolts of this alleged skepticism. To illustrate, Lampert often acknowledges that Nietzsche's philosophy takes a lasting turn toward science with HH, and he attributes to Nietzsche a kind of naturalism, the view that philosophy as an activity should be carried out in a way continuous with the methods or results of the natural sciences (56-59; 89-90). How this would square with the radical epistemology he attributes to Nietzsche is a mystery. Or, I should say, it is left shrouded in mystery with little attempt at reconciliation. This is strange, since the reconciliation of these two apparently contradictory views is a formidable philosophical problem with decisive implications for Nietzsche interpretation. But Lampert behaves for most of the book as though he doesn't even see the problem. In the final sections (263-66, 318-19), he gestures at a unified resolution to the tension between Nietzsche's skepticism and his naturalism, but the apparent proposal -- that individual beings resist reduction to natural necessities, and that these necessities themselves are subject to change and flux -- will offer small solace to Lampert's philosophical reader.

At other times, Lampert seems to avoid the most pressing of his exegetical and scholarly duties. In the course of a close reading of Schopenhauer as Educator, he claims that

the Platonic goal [of establishing a state with the objective of producing more Platos] can be said to be Nietzsche's most basic political motive from the beginning to the end of his career -- despite the unforgettable critiques of Plato's actual teachings in Nietzsche's best-known works. (85)

It is true that much of Nietzsche's critique, especially late in his career, aims at making great persons possible. Is this a political motive or a cultural one? Was this really Plato's motive? On a superficial reading of the Republic, it might seem so, but Nietzsche was no superficial reader. Moreover, it strikes me as deeply un-Nietzschean to draw the distinction on which Lampert depends here, namely, that between Plato's larger philosophical motives and his system of "teachings." It is a fact about human nature, Nietzsche claims with some plausibility, that morality and metaphysics track to a philosopher's psychological type (Beyond Good and Evil 6). Thus, it is impossible for me to read Nietzsche's scathing rebuke of Plato in Twilight of the Idols ("What I Owe to the Ancients") as respecting a distinction between Plato the person and Plato the metaphysician, and I am unaware of any textual evidence from the published works that strongly suggests otherwise. Lampert, for his part, produces none.

This is no minor point, given Lampert's Straussian leanings; such a view of Nietzsche will need to discover deep common cause between Nietzsche and Plato. Lampert senses the weight of this requirement but ultimately refuses to shoulder it, sometimes by deferring to the authority of other "political" Nietzsche commentators such as Hugo Drochon (e.g., 53n25), at other times by plundering Nietzsche's Nachlass for "proof." Indeed, the way to Lampert's conclusions about Plato and Nietzsche is paved with nuggets from the Nachlass (50-53). The status of Nietzsche's Nachlass as a source of evidence for Nietzsche scholarship is, of course, a vexed question. There are reasons -- some of them sensible -- for relying on the extant notebooks and other paralipomena, though some interpreters, most notably Heidegger, have taken a regrettably cavalier approach. Lampert portrays himself as divided. While acknowledging the centrality of the notebooks to his analysis, he is more cautious in a footnote: "I do not regard the notebooks as ever taking priority over the books Nietzsche honed for publication" (13, n16). Yet I doubt whether anyone wishing to impute a "secret doctrine" to Nietzsche can live up to this standard. I doubt even more whether, as a matter of fact, Lampert does so.

That might be understandable and even to a degree excusable if, as I suggested at the beginning of this review, Lampert's book is best understood as a literary biography and psychological portrait of Nietzsche the man instead of a rigorous study of Nietzsche the philosopher. But this book has more philosophical aspirations, aspirations that are sacrificed for the sake of a sweeping vision of "what Nietzsche was all about." Thus, while it will grab the attention of many Nietzsche enthusiasts, it risks portraying Nietzsche's published work as philosophically frivolous.