I was asked this week why the whole list is used for prevalence adjustment rather than the age adjusted subgroup. Is this unfair on practices? Well the answer is no, it is actually more fair the way it is, but for some quite complicated reasons. We have to look at some maths.

$$\begin{array}{c}\mathrm{Point}\mathrm{value}=\mathrm{\pounds}160\times \frac{\mathrm{PracPrev}}{\mathrm{AvgPrev}}\times \frac{\mathrm{PracList}}{\mathrm{AvgList}}\\ \\ \mathrm{Point}\mathrm{value}=\mathrm{\pounds}160\times \frac{(\frac{\mathrm{Register}}{\mathrm{PracList}})}{(\frac{\mathrm{AvgReg}}{\mathrm{AvgList}})}\times \frac{\mathrm{PracList}}{\mathrm{AvgList}}\\ \\ \mathrm{Point}\mathrm{value}=\mathrm{\pounds}160\times \frac{\mathrm{Register}}{\overline{)\mathrm{PracList}}}\times \frac{\overline{)\mathrm{AvgList}}}{\mathrm{AvgReg}}\times \frac{\overline{)\mathrm{PracList}}}{\overline{)\mathrm{AvgList}}}\\ \\ \mathrm{Point}\mathrm{value}=\mathrm{\pounds}160\times \frac{\mathrm{Register}}{\mathrm{AvgReg}}\end{array}$$

We have started from saying that the point value is modified by the practice prevalence relative to the average practice prevalence. Then the point value is modified by the relative size of the practice list overall. The second line expands this a bit by using the register size and the list size against the averages. It is true that this is not exactly how the average prevalence is calculated but it is pretty close.

After simplifying the formula there is a lot we can cancel from the top and bottom until we get to the final formula which basically says that the practice gets a set amount per person on the register but that this drops as the national average register size rises. Nothing else matters.

We can try again using an 'Eligible' denominator for the register.

$$\begin{array}{c}\mathrm{Point}\mathrm{value}=\mathrm{\pounds}160\times \frac{\mathrm{PracPrev}}{\mathrm{AvgPrev}}\times \frac{\mathrm{PracList}}{\mathrm{AvgList}}\\ \\ \mathrm{Point}\mathrm{value}=\mathrm{\pounds}160\times \frac{(\frac{\mathrm{Register}}{\mathrm{Eligible}})}{(\frac{\mathrm{AvgReg}}{\mathrm{AvgEgble}})}\times \frac{\mathrm{PracList}}{\mathrm{AvgList}}\\ \\ \mathrm{Point}\mathrm{value}=\mathrm{\pounds}160\times \frac{\mathrm{Register}}{\mathrm{Eligible}}\times \frac{\mathrm{AvgEgble}}{\mathrm{AvgReg}}\times \frac{\mathrm{PracList}}{\mathrm{AvgList}}\\ \\ \mathrm{Point}\mathrm{value}=\mathrm{\pounds}160\times \frac{\mathrm{AvgEgble}}{\mathrm{Eligible}}\times \frac{\mathrm{Register}}{\mathrm{AvgReg}}\times \frac{\mathrm{PracList}}{\mathrm{AvgList}}\end{array}$$There is much the same process here but there is a lot less to cancel out. That is not necessarily a bad thing but we can see how this formula behaves. If we assume a practice of average list size then the last term will be one. If it has an average register size for diabetes then the middle term will be one as well. Interestingly in this case the point value would vary with the proportion of over 17 year olds on the practice list (i.e. Eligible would change without changing the overall list size). This is not what we want to see at all as the practice list makeup would alter income without any change to the actual number of patients treated.

So that is why the overall list size is used to calculate prevalence.

## 2 comments:

Can you please explain the rationale for changing the indicator codes each year or for some years? The descriptors stay the same but the codes change. I would be interested to get a better understanding of why they change?

Hi

There is generally some change although this can often be around the reseting of dates or other small details. A few years ago there was a general renumbering where the indicators were standardised to having three letters and three digits.

The codes used on the site are mostly those used by the individual countries with a couple of exceptions where I have created pseudo indicators (these include those ending in "prev" or "adj") and in one case where Scotland listed two indicators with the same code.

I do try to link them together on the site although as the matches tend to be close although not exact.

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