What Art is Like, In Constant Reference to the Alice Books

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Miguel Tamen, What Art is Like, In Constant Reference to the Alice Books, Harvard University Press, 2012, 128pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674067066.

Reviewed by Peter Lamarque, University of York


Miguel Tamen is the René Magritte of philosophy, revealing the extraordinary in the ordinary, the mysterious in the mundane, making the familiar unfamiliar, and all in a style entirely his own. He is also philosophy's Wallace Stevens, a crafter of words, revelling in poetic invention, often elusive, sometimes allusive, always hinting at something deeper, content for the reader to fill in the gaps. Those who enjoyed his earlier book Friends of Interpretable Objects (Harvard, 2001) will enthusiastically embrace this new one. The ground is somewhat the same -- the multiple ways we interact with art -- but while the frame of reference in the earlier book ranged from Wittgenstein and Quine to Friedrich Karl von Savigny and Saint Theodore of Studion, here there are no references beyond the weird hermetically sealed world of the Walrus, Humpty Dumpty, the Red Queen, the Mock Turtle, and the full cast of characters from Lewis Carroll's timeless masterpieces Alice's Adventures in Wonderland (1865) and Through the Looking-Glass, and What Alice Found There (1871). As the sub-title tells us, the discussion proceeds "In Constant Reference to the Alice Books" and sure enough there are no names in the text other than those of these whacky yet endurably familiar curiosities.

This is a philosophy book like no other. It has a twin identity anticipated in the two parts of its title: a book about art, or strictly the philosophy of art, and a book about Alice and her friends. But even that is not quite right as the two parts are far more integrated than it might suggest. It is always about the philosophy of art but always embedded in the Alice frame. We will observe a bit later how this works in practice.

Tamen foresees that his readers might be puzzled about what exactly is going on. So he provides a helpful and short introduction explaining "What to Expect". What we shouldn't expect, he tells us, is a book about the Alice books; it is not a book of criticism or interpretation. Nor is any claim made that the Alice books are themselves about art, even if "it may . . . be the case that how someone came to see the arts may owe much to the Alice books." Rather, we are offered "analogies and similes", many in the service of a general theme that "talking about art should be seen as contiguous with talking about many other relevant and important things and, indeed, with many other human activities" (p.2). The most helpful guidance comes from the Analytical Table of Contents at the end. This gives a succinct one sentence summary for each of the (199 in total) numbered paragraphs that make up the book. (Only an Alice-lover could have resisted giving us a nice round 200 paragraphs! Humpty Dumpty would have scorned anything so neat.) I am sure every reader will welcome these summaries since -- like reading Wallace Stevens -- it is not always entirely clear in the text how the analogies are working.

If you insist that progress in philosophy can only be made through arguments, definitions, theses, refutations, engagement with the standard literature, and so forth, then this book is probably not for you. If, though, you allow that important ideas can emerge in surprising ways, suggested rather than spelt out, that an unexpected analogy can prompt genuine insight, or that an intellectual mystery tour in the company of madcap characters and an urbane guide might be as rewarding as a formal lecture from the podium then you will delight in what Tamen has to offer.

Of course philosophy is no stranger to the Alice books. It is not hard to find philosophical themes amid the playful absurdities: sense/nonsense, existence/nonexistence, dreaming/reality, the logical/the contradictory, the possible/the impossible, make-believe/truth, words/things, even the child-like/the profound. But although some of these metaphysical or epistemological dichotomies, inevitably, are alluded to in Tamen's text, he prefers less obvious highways and byways to prompt his investigations into "what art is like".

So what are his chosen themes? The four chapter headings don't give much away: "Ideas", "Furniture", "A Mistake", "What Happens". Very roughly, Ch. 1 ("Ideas") covers the content or subject matter of works of art and our ("fuzzy") access to it; Ch. 2 ("Furniture") concerns the objects, notably fictional objects, that works are about; Ch. 3 ("A Mistake") covers the values of art, in particular the mistake of thinking that there is some ultimate tribunal for grounding value judgments; Ch. 4 ("What Happens") emphasises the personal nature of art ("whatever happens with art must at least happen to you"). This, it should be stressed, is very rough and involves just the kind of pinning down that the book disapproves of and discourages.

What does it all look like on the page? Here is one not untypical passage:

§66. The Mock Turtle is an animal, and one that does not exist. And a character is frequently, though not always, a person, and often a person that does not exist. "You look a little shy," the Red Queen says to Alice, "let me introduce you to that leg of mutton." Surely Mutton seems to be nothing but a character. Would this mean that the Queen is introducing Alice to a character? Of course not. Introducing something as a character would be as strange as introducing someone as an attribute: 'Meet blue,' 'Meet false,' 'Meet even.' We wouldn't be able to begin to make sense of such ceremonies. So 'leg of mutton' is probably not best described as the name of a character, like 'shade of blue' or 'kind of false.' It helps little to say that action-capable pieces of furniture in books are characters, let alone nothing but characters. It suggests an unnecessary kind of furniture. If you need to have a technical term, 'agents' would do well enough. Alice calls them 'creatures,' an even better word. Would you actually expect all action-capable furniture to talk back? And would describing these pieces of furniture as characters change your expectations, as when you describe something as false butter? (pp.29-30)

What's going on here? On the face of it, it seems to have something to do with the philosophical topic of the "status" of fictional characters. But the Alice example complicates matters. In the scene at hand (and it is only many pages later -- pp.42-43 -- in a different context that Tamen reminds us of this) the Red Queen introduces Alice to a leg of mutton on the dining table by announcing "Alice -- Mutton: Mutton -- Alice," at which point the leg of mutton "got up in the dish and made a little bow to Alice." When Alice offers to give the Queen a slice, the Queen reprimands her: "it isn't etiquette to cut anyone you've been introduced to," at which point the mutton is removed. Is there not a character here after all? "Mutton" (capital "M") looks like a proper name and the "furniture" is shown to be "action-capable" (bowing). But we philosophers who earnestly pursue the question (is the leg of mutton a fictional character?) now simply look ridiculous.

Tamen is nudging us away from our stock philosophical presuppositions. But it is not as if he has no line of his own. He acknowledges fiction-talk but seeks to demystify it. What he seems to be saying is that we just don't need an elaborate "theory of fictional discourse"; it is enough that we know how the game is played. "You have no particular problem with the Walrus, Walrus feelings, and Walrus facts. . . . You know, for instance, that Walrus garrulity is not to be explained by natural selection" (p.27). Furthermore:

You don't talk about non-existent people in scare quotes. You don't feel-scare-quote the feelings and beliefs you develop in relation to non-existent people. And this indicates that there rarely is the risk of any confusion, even when you say that the greatest tragedy in your life was the death of Mutton. You don't "like" the Walrus best. You don't have to pretend to like it best. You like it best. If people know you well enough they will know the signs of your having changed your mind about things; and they will also know when you change your mind about the Walrus. (pp.30-31)

Pitying Mutton or liking Walrus is not a "quasi emotion" (a scare quote emotion), not a matter of pretending, it is just what it seems to be, once the context is acknowledged. Tamen is using Lewis Carroll's nonsense to take a no-nonsense line. Just as Alice is frustrated by the looking glass logic of Humpty Dumpty so Tamen seems to find philosophers obtuse in creating problems where none exist. It would be begrudging to point out that, on the topic of fiction, a similar line of thought has appeared before, say, in Richard Rorty's famous paper "Is there a problem about fictional discourse?" (1982) or in Much Ado About Nonexistence: Fiction and Reference by A.P Martinich and Avrum Stroll (2007). What matters is the dialectic. Tamen is not arguing but showing.

In fact the discussion of fiction-talk fits into a wider theme of "art-talk." The art-talk theme runs throughout the book and, not least in virtue of cropping up in so many different Alice-contexts, is not always easy to grasp. Well, strictly it is not easy to pin down; but as pinning down is what we are not supposed to do maybe the difficulty is of our own making. Philosophers reading the book are likely to latch onto what look like claims being made. Here is a small selection: "Dealing with art does not require that you change any of your humdrum assumptions about facts of nature. It is not a special dealing" (p.48); "art-talk is not a special kind of talk if by that you are to mean that the truth of its statements is ascertained in some art-like way" (p.49); "Imagining art-talk as a distinct activity or even as a set of related activities is the sort of mistake you make when you describe a crowd moving about a busy city street as engaged in a particular sort of ceremony, for instance, a race" (p.55). So far, this is the motif, mentioned earlier, that "talking about art should be seen as contiguous with talking about many other relevant and important things." Fair enough, but being "contiguous with" allows for considerable wiggle room.

Another motif seems to suggest that talking about art is not quite like talking about shoes and ships and sealing wax: now "art is something that happens to you" (p.75). "Art is sometimes not further away from you than your thoughts, beliefs, and impressions, not further away from you than your soul" (p.75). Is art, then, in the mind? No, we must finish the sentence: "not further away from you than your soul, your Knoxville pictures, or your feet." Such a list is disarming, yet true to the looking glass world. It seems irreverent to ask if we do talk about our souls as about our Knoxville pictures. The Analytical Table of Contents, usually so good at bringing things down to earth, does not help much here: "Art is more like a thought, or like your feet" (p.105).

Here is another articulation of what looks like the same motif: "Art is not a separate world, not a special world that may be described separately from you, like a set of thoughts not entertained by anyone, or perhaps a set of disembodied feet" (p.90). But just what is the analogy? That I can no more separate myself from art than thoughts from a mind, or feet from a body? "Art is always stuff about, and thus often very much a part of who you are in the world. Stuff about is so-around you like thoughts. This simile only expresses the fact that you know it wouldn't make any sense for you to describe it as over-there" (p.90). Whatever we make of this, it does seem to set art apart from more mundane things in our world.

Think of art-talk as being more like, as Alice says, "sending presents to one's own feet." By art-talking you often express a sense of something you can't quite tell yourself apart from, something as contiguous to you as your own feet. You may still officially say that the song is talking, but you know fully well that you do all the talking, and mostly do it to send presents to the song. Sending presents to art may express who you are and certainly is who certain people are like. When art is so-around you, you will often send it presents. Most, though not all, presents are of the verbal sort. This is what honoring art mostly amounts to -- and it is by no means a lesser thing about art. If art matters to you, art is something you honor as being so-around you, not something you describe as being over-there. (p.79)

This is tough, and the final chapter from which it comes is not for the faint hearted. Just what is the relation of art to mind? It might be true, but it seems not enough, to say that art is nothing without human responses to art. Perhaps art is, as philosophers say, "intentional" in the sense of being essentially an object of thought. What interests Tamen is not just what we do for art but what art does for us. He sees art, as others have before him, as connected with questions about self-identity ("Who are you?") but also as a way of ducking such questions or deflecting them, via "telling adventures," to "Where are you?" (pp.88-89). It is "Where are you?" that so troubles Alice. He also ruminates on what it is to lose art ("you lose art like you lose beliefs, not like you lose a person" ([p.106)]).

And of course there is so much more. The Caucus-race -- "They began running when they liked, and left off when they liked, so that it was not easy to know when the race was over" and "everybody has won" (p.53) -- is compared to art-talk ("In art-talk you always win, but since you are only competing with yourself, you also always lose" ([p.57)]). Another comparison is with the court case over the stolen tarts, in which the Queen pronounces "Sentence first -- verdict afterwards" (p.63). Maybe we shouldn't struggle too much trying to work out the analogies. Maybe, as with some poetry, the striking image or the unlikely juxtaposition is doing the bulk of the work. Trying to derive a thesis is to miss the point. For fans of the Alice books it is a treat in itself to rehearse these delightful scenes and it is a bonus to do so in a new context, which promises to shed light on puzzles from elsewhere. But the seriousness of purpose is never lost and Tamen is a master at keeping us amused and instructed. This is a book that should be widely read, not just by philosophers or aestheticians or even lovers of the Alice stories but by anyone who enjoys stylish writing, intellectual playfulness, and, well, René Magritte and Wallace Stevens.