What Biological Functions Are and Why They Matter

Placeholder book cover

Justin Garson, What Biological Functions Are and Why They Matter, Cambridge, 2019, 235pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108472593.

Reviewed by Brandon A. Conley, Cornell University


Why do zebras have stripes? While biologists worry about what the function of zebra stripes is, philosophers have long worried about what exactly biologists are worried about. What exactly is it for zebra stripes, or any other biological trait, to have a particular function? In his aptly titled book, Justin Garson develops and defends an account of biological functions he dubs the "generalized selected effects" (GSE) theory, and applies it to a laundry list of extant philosophical debates in which the concept of function looms large. According to selected effect accounts, an item's function is whatever it does that has been favored by a history of natural selection. GSE generalizes this approach by relying on a less restrictive notion of a selective process, treating natural selection as a special case. In addition to developing and applying GSE, Garson deftly defends selected effect approaches more generally against a range of common objections.

The book should be of special interest to anyone with a stake in the function debate or the issues to which Garson applies his GSE account. Some of these issues include the nature of mental disorder and disease more generally, the nature of mechanisms, and the tenability of teleosemantics as an account of intentionality. Those looking for a general overview of the philosophy of functions will be better served by Garson's (2016) A Critical Overview of Biological Functions. However, his new book does an excellent job explaining just what makes functions philosophically puzzling and interesting, so it would serve well as an introduction to the topic for someone interested more in the applications of functions to other philosophical issues or who simply wants a snapshot of current work in the field. Garson's writing is engaging and accessible, and the book touches on many topics. These virtues make it a viable option for inclusion on the syllabus of an undergraduate course in philosophy of biology.

The book is divided into three parts. In the first, Garson provides some general background. Chapter 1 lays out why functions are philosophically problematic and what, in his view, an account of function should explain. Chapter 2 focuses on defending the idea that the notion of a selected effect must play a central role in an account of biological functions. The defense includes responses to various objections to selected effect accounts and an argument for the importance of what Garson calls "explanatory depth." By "explanatory depth" he means the way in which functions are invoked to explain why something exists. Biologists ask about the function of zebra stripes by asking "why do zebras have stripes?" The point is not new, but he develops and defends the importance of this point with special care because it is central to his overall argument. In Chapter 3, Garson argues that several accounts of function can be rejected because they do not take seriously the explanatory depth of functions. He also argues that two views that do capture the explanatory depth of functions, namely, organizational accounts and the weak etiological account, should be rejected for independent reasons.

In the second part, Garson develops his GSE account. Chapter 4 introduces the possibility of generalizing selected effect accounts. For example, we might be tempted to say that trial and error learning can generate new functions, and the process appears to consist in a kind of selection. However, behaviors favored in a process of trial and error learning do not reproduce, so it is simply a mistake to think of trial and error learning as a kind of natural selection. Garson argues that this problem has blocked past attempts to apply selected effect accounts to a range of selection processes that appear to generate new functions, and this represents a shortcoming of traditional selected effect theories. Chapter 5 is devoted to the example of neural selection, another process in which Garson argues that it appears a selection process generates new functions, but without any kind of reproduction.

In Chapter 6, Garson lays out his generalized selected effect theory of functions. In essence, he argues that selected effect views have unnecessarily limited their range of application and tools for addressing problem cases by building the notion of reproduction into the definition of function possession. Therefore, we should drop this arbitrary restriction. Functions, according to Garson, are activities that have contributed to past differential reproduction or retention in a population. He is careful to note that the argument for this generalization of the traditional selected effect account is not based on an argument from analogy. His point is not that processes of differential retention like neural selection or trial and error learning are enough like natural selection to count. Rather, his point is that his account has all of the same theoretical advantages as traditional selected effect accounts, in particular the ability to capture the explanatory depth of functions, but without the arbitrary restriction introduced by requiring reproduction. The change is subtle, but Garson devotes the rest of the book to showing that it has important ramifications.

Garson also argues that the explicit reference to a population is an important feature of his definition because it allows GSE to deal with some potentially damning counterexamples. Removing reproduction as a requirement for the kind of selective process that can generate functions opens the door for any kind of sorting process to ground function attributions. Given a variety of rocks of varying hardness on a beach, some will be differentially retained in the collection as the softer rocks erode away, but it would be terribly odd if a theory of biological functions delivered the result that the hardness of rocks on a beach has the function of staving off erosion. Garson's response is that a collection of rocks is not a population in the relevant sense. While he does not attempt to develop a full theory of what makes a collection a population, in the sense relevant to biologists, he argues that at the very least populations must have the right kind of interaction between its various members. On even a minimal characterization of what that means, collections of rocks are not populations.

In Chapters 7 and 8, respectively, Garson addresses the problem of functional underdetermination and the problem of defining what it is for something to malfunction. Here, too, Garson has much of interest to say, but I will pass over the details of these discussions.

In the final section of the book, the focus is on applications of GSE. In Chapter 9 Garson critiques the common view that biological subdisciplines can be subdivided into those that use a selected effect concept of function and those that use an alternative concept of functions as ahistorical causal roles. Chapter 10 explores the connection between functions and mechanisms. Garson argues that the link is much tighter than has been recognized in extant work on mechanisms. When biologists use the term "mechanism" to mean more than simply "causal pathway," a part of a mechanism for X-ing must have the function, as defined by GSE, of X-ing. For example, if the beating of a heart is a mechanism for pumping blood, that beating must have the function of pumping blood. A surprising corollary of this claim is that there can be no mechanisms for dysfunctional processes. Garson embraces this implication of his views as an important insight, arguing that it can contribute to biomedical research by turning attention from the search for disease mechanisms to the search for how mechanisms for healthy processes can break.

Given Garson's application of GSE to the search for mechanisms in medicine, one would reasonably expect him to defend the influential idea that disease is a special case of dysfunction, suitably amended in light of GSE. Surprisingly, Garson argues in Chapter 11 that we should not define mental disorders, and possibly disease more generally, in terms of dysfunction because it is quite plausible that many paradigmatic mental disorders are functional. The idea already has traction among many mental health professionals, and Garson argues that GSE supports at least the possibility that many mental disorders are functional responses to environmental shifts. Conduct disorder, for example, can result when certain behavioral and thought patterns are differentially retained in a dangerous environment because of benefits they confer in that environment, and the individual is then removed from the dangerous environment. While GSE will not settle the question of whether any given mental disorder is functional, Garson argues that it supports the idea that this could be the case, and that is enough to rule out definitions of mental disorders as a particular kind of biological dysfunction.

The final chapter applies GSE to teleosemantics. In short, GSE expands the range of selection processes that can generate new functions, so if having semantic content is partly explicated in terms of function possession, then GSE expands the range of processes that can generate new representational content.

Garson's book is well argued, well written, and full of useful insights. Its only significant flaw is that the case for GSE is a bit overstated. It relies heavily on ruling out alternative views. However, while GSE certainly emerges as a view to be taken seriously, that it enjoys a decisive advantage over both organizational accounts and traditional selected effect accounts is far from clear.

To oversimplify a bit, organizational accounts claim that an item's function is whatever it does that contributes to its own self maintenance. Garson argues that these accounts are overly liberal, permitting function attributions to things that do not have functions. His case leans very heavily on the example of panic disorder. Panic attacks can be self-perpetuating because they can cause behavioral and thought patterns that make more panic attacks more likely. Panic disorder thus appears to meet the requirements of a self-maintaining system. Garson considers several ways in which organizational accounts can rule out the case, including appeals to complexity or "organizational differentiation," but he argues that none block the implication that panic attacks are functional.

The case is admittedly counterintuitive, but it does not strike me as counterintuitive enough to rule out organizational accounts on its own. More seriously, Garson argues a few chapters later that it's quite plausible that many mental disorders are functional. If he can argue that GSE supports this idea, I see no reason why defenders of organizational accounts cannot say the same. It is no less counterintuitive when Garson says delusions caused by schizophrenia may well have a function than it would be for an organizational theorist to say panic attacks have one. Of course, Garson could point out that he claims schizophrenia has a function for the person who has it while the counterexample relies on the claim that panic attacks have a function for the panic disorder itself, but it is far from clear that the difference can carry the weight of ruling out an otherwise attractive alternative.

Perhaps most seriously of all, Garson expresses skepticism that organizational theorists can provide satisfying explications of concepts like complexity or organizational differentiation that they need to rule out counterexamples, but the GSE similarly relies on the as of yet unexplained concept of a population to achieve the same thing. Recall, Garson rules out rocks on a beach having functions by invoking the notion of a population, and that in turn is only partially explained in terms of interaction between members of the population. This is not a fatal problem for GSE, but it is far from clear that we have any reason to think that a fully developed concept of a population that will vindicate GSE will be more forthcoming than a fully developed concept of organization that will vindicate organizational views.

On that note, there remains much work to be done to develop the concept of a population, and I did not find the minimal characterization Garson offers quite satisfactory for ruling out the class of counterexamples that threaten GSE. In a variation of the example where rocks differentially erode on a beach, Garson considers rocks in a pile grinding against one another and eroding due to friction. This example is interesting because the rocks are interacting, but Garson wants to say they do not form a population. Each rock only interacts with adjacent rocks, but there is a much greater degree of interactivity in a population, with every individual interacting, perhaps indirectly, with almost every other. However, it is not difficult to amend the example so that almost every rock interacts with almost every other rock. Simply put all the rocks in a spacious container and have a machine shake the container so hard that the rocks are worn away by constant collisions as they fly around inside. As with the original example, harder rocks will be retained while softer rocks wear away to dust. To rule out GSE delivering the result that the hardness of rocks has the function of staving off erosion, Garson needs to rule out that these rocks are in a population as well.

This worry also raises the possibility that the role of reproduction in more traditional selected effect theories is not as unnecessary as Garson paints it to be. It strikes me as entirely plausible that the nature of a population may be best explicated, at least partially, in terms of reproductive relationships. This would explain why biologists do not consider separate interacting species to be part of a single population. It is important here that Garson accepts that traditional selected effect accounts can capture many (most?) of the examples that motivate GSE indirectly, because the mechanisms underlying processes like trial and error learning or neural selection have themselves been shaped by natural selection. Garson contends that this move is simply an epicycle introduced to cancel the complications introduced by defining function possession in a way that requires reproduction. GSE's main advantage over traditional selected effect accounts thus hinges on the prospects for explicating populations without appeal to reproduction.

None of these issues undermine the value of Garson's contribution to our understanding of functions or why they matter. First, if a devastating criticism of GSE were published tomorrow, Garson's book has provided an especially wide-ranging demonstration of why philosophers should care whether GSE, or any other theory of functions, is right. It would impact our understanding of a surprisingly varied array of other issues, both philosophical and scientific. Second, though I think Garson's case for GSE may be a bit overstated, it remains formidable, nonetheless, and GSE will certainly occupy a central place in the ongoing debate about what functions are.