What Can Philosophy Contribute to Ethics?

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James Griffin, What Can Philosophy Contribute to Ethics?, Oxford University Press, 2015, 157pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198748090.

Reviewed by Bradford Cokelet, University of Kansas


In this slim, dense book, James Griffin urges moral and political philosophers to adopt a new, anti-systematic methodology. His negative target is philosophers who think, "that [their] job is to take the ethics of society in hand, analyze it into parts, purge it of bad ideas, and organize the good into a systematic moral theory" (1). Griffin attacks this method of analysis, purification, and theory construction and proposes an unsystematic alternative. He thinks moral philosophers should stick to identifying and re-engineering troublesomely indeterminate moral concepts such as justice, equality, and human rights.


After identifying a problematic concept, Griffin recommends a three-pronged program for improvement: (a) deploy the concept in first order normative judgments about complex, real world cases, (b) reflect on the historical genesis and different available ways of understanding the concept, and (c) work with non-philosophers to figure out how we can improve or change the concept to make it both determinate and effective in practice. There need not be a strict division of intellectual labor, but philosophers can presumably take the lead on the first task and defer a bit more to others (e.g. lawyers, political scientists, historians, and psychologists) when tackling the second and third ones.


If we work together and accomplish these tasks, then we will contribute to the ethics of society in one of two ways. In some cases, we will identify a refined, more determinate version of a troublesome concept and can work to promote its social use. This is what Griffin thinks we can do for the concept of human rights, and he began the refinement process in his earlier book, On Human Rights. To compete that specific project, I think he needs to make the concepts of normative agency and human practicalities, which he uses, much more determinate, but Griffin is apparently optimistic about his ability to do that. In other cases, inquiry will reveal that inherited, problematic concepts have no determinate and normatively significant replacement. We may find that the concept is less important than people tend to think, or that it is irredeemably problematic. In these cases, Griffin suggests that the concept be de-emphasized or phased out of use; he provisionally sentences the concept of equality to this fate in chapter 8 (105-113).


I have begun with a summary of Griffin's positive methodological recommendations, which do not get laid out until rather late in the text. Most of the book -- six out of eight chapters -- is devoted to the negative thesis that philosophers should abandon ethical theorizing. We will turn to that argument presently, but I thought it best to begin by highlighting Griffin's positive recommendations for a couple of reasons: first, they might interest various philosophers working on conceptual engineering or revision, and, second, practitioners of moral theory can make use of Griffin's positive recommendations even if they reject his anti-theory argument.


Griffin's argument against ethical theory is prefaced with a quick, whiggish history of western ethical practice from Homeric Greece to today (3-21). The basic story is that we have made a lot of progress up through the Enlightenment but that the Enlightenment philosophers, who so admirably improved the ethical practices they inherited, left us with some serious baggage. Specifically, they left us with bad methodological habits and widespread false assumptions about the value of problematic concepts. Methodologically, Enlightenment veneration of Newtonian science led people to think that moral philosophers should build systematic theories that either (a) naturalistically explain ethical practice or (b) normatively improve it by analyzing and systematizing the ethical beliefs embedded in it. Griffin argues that neither theoretical endeavor is useful if one aims to contribute to ethical practice, and that philosophers can better spend their time investigating indeterminate concepts -- for example, the dubious concept of equality that was popularized during the Enlightenment.


Griffin's brief cultural history sets the stage for his main arguments. Roughly, he attacks normative system builders in chapters 2, 3, and 6, attacks naturalistic system builders in chapters 4 and 5, critically distances himself from Williams' anti-theory views in chapter 6, and makes the case for his "concept specification" alternative to theory construction in chapters 7 and 8. I will focus on his attack on normative moral theorizing.


Griffin's core attack on normative system-builders is developed in chapters 1-3 and 6, and his thesis is that systematic normative theory can't guide, or to contribute to, ethics, understood as a concrete psychological-social practice. I find his argument difficult to make out, but as I read him, Griffin begins by arguing that the prescriptions and prohibitions embedded in our practices will, or should, respect a restrictive "ought implies can" principle. In effect, Griffin thinks that the oughts embedded in ordinary practice will (or should) be curtailed by the normal motivational and epistemic limitations we find in non-saintly human beings -- what he calls 'human practicalities.' For example, he holds that the prescriptions and prohibitions embedded our practices should never require us to live in heroically self-sacrificial ways (30-35). Next, Griffin argues that systematic moral theorizing is methodologically flawed because it will inevitably fail to identify passable prescriptions and prohibitions, which can be applied and followed by normal human beings -- who are made of rather crooked epistemic and motivational timber.


On first exposure, this crooked timber argument against systematic moral theory is hard to assess because it is not obvious what makes a theory systematic or why Griffin thinks that systematic theory construction must yield a prescriptions and prohibitions that normal humans can't apply and follow. I am not sure I fully understand his views, but we can usefully start from the general characterization of systematic normative theorists he gives in chapter 6:


When philosophers confront a set of normative beliefs, they wonder about justification. What are the grounds for what? Justification will exhibit a structure: there will be a basic belief or basic beliefs, then beliefs derived from the basic beliefs, and perhaps beliefs derived from these first-level beliefs, and so on. This structure of justification, if it formed some sort of unity, would constitute a system. Another way of putting this is that when philosophers confront a set of ethical beliefs, they look for its explanatory capacities. What makes actions wrong? If different things make them wrong, how are these things related? Do they themselves exhibit some form of organization? (84)


Philosophers who recognize themselves in this description will certainly wonder why they can't improve on ethical practice by thinking about subtle cases, finding principles that underlie different particular judgments, and working to fit disparate principles and judgments together into a coherent system. Griffin's answer, I think, is that insofar as philosophers myopically focus on various evaluative or normative beliefs or facts and attempt to discern the explanatory or justificatory structure that underlies them, they will simply ignore the epistemic and motivational limitations of normal human beings. The same goes for philosophers aiming to rationally revise the beliefs they find in their inherited practice.


Griffin allows that theorists will notice some human practicalities -- for example ones that justify or explain inherited moral beliefs or posited evaluative facts -- but he is confident that there will always be some left over. There will always be human epistemic and motivational limitations that will look irrelevant from the systematic, theoretical point of view. Because system builders will ignore these facts, they will endorse or continue to look for prescriptions and prohibitions that run afoul of Griffin's "ought implies can" principle and his account of normal human limits. For example, consider what Griffin says about justified partiality:


What do the limits of human motivation . . . and human knowledge . . . suggest about ethics? They suggest, first of all, that there is a large domain of non-proscribed partiality. There is often no moral fault in being partial to one's spouse, one's children, one's more extended family, to the career and causes and institutions that matter to one, to one's community and so forth. Obviously some partialities can be justified impartially: the structure of society will often require parents to take special care of their own children. And some partialities may be justifiable non-impartially: it may be -- it is certainly widely thought to be -- a basic moral norm that parents owe more to their own children than they do to the children of strangers. But I want to suggest that there is a domain of non-proscribed partiality simply because one may not demand what human motivation cannot deliver. (58)


To fully assess this argument and its application to their favored brand of theory construction, readers can turn to Griffin's more specific, albeit terse, discussions of various representative systematic theories -- for example, Kantian (116-118), Consequentialist (43-59), and Rossian Intuitionist (118-120) theories. In addition, Griffin discusses several topics in applied ethics -- torture, harming the innocent, and the extent of justified partiality (59-56; 86-92) -- and argues that bottom-up topic-driven systematic theorization fares no better than top-down, global approaches. For example, consider his remarks about torture:


we find that we can list all the moral considerations relevant to torture: the pain or distress of the person tortured, the evil of what the torturer does, and so on. But we found that these purely moral considerations alone do not yield an absolute prohibition on torture. Nor can we combine them into a general principle that determines when torture is justified and when it is not . . . [But] we have to in some way find an answer to the question: What should we do? I made the case for our answering to this effect: we must adopt an exceptionless ban on torture, and hope that someone, unspecified and unappointed, will on his or her own initiative resort to torture in order to avert truly great catastrophe . . . what is important for our purposes is that any answer to the question will be a recommendation of a special policy [and] the policy will not be based entirely on ethical values; nor will it be assessable in terms of truth and falsity; it will be a way (sensible, we hope) to accommodate certain human limitations. (89)


Let's assume that Griffin is right about your favored moral theory. Let's assume that you have a systematic account of our moral beliefs or the evaluative facts but that your theory entails prohibitions or prescriptions which cannot be applied and followed by normal human beings. Perhaps your theory entails that people ought to live in ways that would require them to heroically sacrifice their well-being. Or maybe epistemic limitations blind normal humans to the facts about how they ought to live (according to your theory). In such cases, Griffin would argue that your theory cannot usefully contribute to our ethical practices because it violates his ought implies can doctrine. But should we accept that doctrine? Does it really support his attack on moral theorizing?


Griffin's version of the ought implies can doctrine is quite strong; it restricts oughts to normal human limitations, not just to physical possibilities or, for example, to the motivations an agent could in principle derive by sound deliberative routes from her current motivational set. Given its strength, one might expect Griffin to give a normative defense, but his main defense is apparently linguistic. In short, he engages with other recent work on ought implies can and argues that his doctrine is a sound "lexical" norm; he claims that, "it would be a misuse of the strong term 'ought'" to say that people ought to live in ways that exceed normal human motivational and epistemic limitations (27).


Griffin's lexical view will be of interest to philosophers working on the ought implies can doctrine or the semantics of 'ought', but more needs to be said before we can accept it. First, his lexical view seems to conflict with ordinary practice and talk. Consider people who have lived through tragic or severely morally demanding situations. They sometimes say that they ought to have heroically sacrificed their own well-being (or life) to save others and they feel guilty because they think they failed to act as they ought to have. It is far from obvious that such people are misusing the strong term 'ought'. In addition, even if Griffin is right about the lexical norms in question, it is unclear why moral theories cannot contribute to ethical practice if they violate those norms. A defender of moral theory might grant that her use of language is somewhat revisionary but contend that her use is also more coherent or true to the normative facts. To communicate effectively with non-philosophers, she may need to flag her deviant use of the strong term 'ought' and her reasons for flaunting ordinary lexical restrictions, but it is unclear why Griffin thinks this will not work or why revisionary uses of language will stop moral theorists from contributing to practice. There are some hints that Griffin wants to give an additional, normative defense of his ought implies can doctrine, which he could appeal to in this context, but I think we can sum things up by saying that his defense of his doctrine is contentious and in need of more development.


Even if Griffin can assuage worries about his ought implies can doctrine and convince us that moral theories must respect it in order to contribute to ethical practice, his attack on theory construction requires additional assumptions about the epistemic and motivational limitations of normal human beings. In discussing this issue, Griffin admits that some saintly and wise human beings have made great self-sacrifices and seen the best moral path when others could not, but he doubts we should conclude that normal humans, in our current society, are capable of similar feats. For example, he writes: "Father Kolbe sacrificed his life in Auschwitz; so he can; so a human being can. But let me ask again: does this show that I can? Surely not. Nor does it show that most human beings can. This might be a case like running a mile in under four minutes: only rare individuals can." (38) In short, Griffin thinks systematic moral theories are defective because they inevitably issue oughts that only rare individuals can recognize and follow and they don't tell us enough about how more normal people ought to act.


As Griffin would admit, his rather pessimistic, rigid view of normal human capacities and the things we need to flourish may be challenged by interdisciplinary work on character development, self-cultivation, human enhancement, and the impact of social structures on normal human psychology. Some moral theorists may grant that normal humans today, or at least those living in certain social environments, cannot live as sound theory says they ought, but they may go on and argue that there are grounds to reasonably hope for improvement. Perhaps systematic moral theory will enable us to identify the true ideal that humans will be able to instantiate once they make more progress. If so, theorists could reject Griffin's attack and add questions about how to straighten out the current crooked timber of humanity to their theoretical agenda. It's not clear that this strategy of response will succeed, and Griffin expresses sensible doubts about some versions of it (32-35), but for all he shows it may yet generate a sound response to his attack on theory construction.


As the foregoing reflections suggest, Griffin's book could be usefully read alongside recent empirically engaged work on character development, self-cultivation, human enhancement, and the impact of social structures on normal human psychology. It could also be usefully read in tandem with John Hare's theistic discussion of the moral gap between normal human abilities and the demands of morality, or Cheshire Calhoun's admirable work, which shows that moral philosophers can engage in systematic theoretical reflection and fruitfully respond to the ordinary ethical practices that are often attuned to, and shaped by, normal human limitations.


In the end, I don't think that Griffin mounts a compelling case against moral theory but he does pose a coherent and serious challenge and pressures us to think more carefully about the aims and methods of moral theory. Even if his attack on theory fails, we should accept his advice and devote more theoretical resources to inter-disciplinary work on the nature of ordinary ethical practice and questions about how we can reasonably hope to improve our social structures, practices, and individual moral psychologies. In addition, moral theorists can take on board Griffin's suggestions about the value of concept-refinement and pursue specific concept-refinement projects in tandem with theory construction. So even if they don't agree with his main argument, Griffin's book can help moral philosophers better contribute to ethics.




Anderson, E., 2010. The imperative of integration. Princeton University Press.

Calhoun, C., 2016. Moral Aims: Essays on the Importance of Getting It Right and Practicing

Morality with Others, Oxford University Press.

Flanagan, O., 2017. The Geography of Morals: Varieties of Moral Possibility, Oxford University Press.

Griffin, J., 2008. On Human Rights, Oxford University Press.

Hare, J., 1996. The Moral Gap: Kantian Ethics, Human Limits, and God's Assistance. Oxford University Press.

Nussbaum, M., 2013. Political Emotions: Why Love Matters for Justice, Harvard University Press.