What Do Philosophers Do? Skepticism and the Practice of Philosophy

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Penelope Maddy, What Do Philosophers Do? Skepticism and the Practice of Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2017, 264 pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190618698.

Reviewed by Alexander Jackson, Boise State University


Penelope Maddy's book inaugurates OUP's publication of the annual Romanell Lectures, aimed at a general readership. Maddy takes on the problem of external world skepticism. The book is called "What Do Philosophers Do?" and Maddy aims to show a general audience how philosophy should be done. She mixes ordinary language philosophy, historical considerations, and scientifically informed common sense. Austin and the later Wittgenstein are the book's philosophical heroes. It's striking how different Maddy's 'therapeutic' philosophizing is from the contemporary analytic approach. Contemporary analytic philosophers evaluate arguments for and against their views and the main alternatives, in conversation with the literature from the last forty years or so. These practices take a back seat in Maddy's therapeutic approach to the skeptical problem. She uses Barry Stroud's (1984) to illustrate the lure of skepticism. Then she creeps up on her solution by discussing suggestive remarks by Austin and the later Wittgenstein. Reading Maddy's book made me realize how deeply committed I am to the contemporary analytic approach. The book consists of three long lectures and two short appendices; I will describe and evaluate the contents roughly in order.

To start Lecture I, Maddy explains that we should not confuse Descartes' Method of Doubt with a skeptical argument (pp. 7-18). Then she addresses the dream argument for skepticism (pp. 18-30). One can know one is not dreaming right now, she claims, on grounds such as: my perceptual experiences are of high acuity and they form a coherent sequence, whereas this is not so of experiences in dreams. This goes by rather quickly. Let's focus on the main skeptical problem the book addresses, starting with how the problem is standardly framed.

A 'brain in a vat' (BIV) is fed apparently normal perceptual experiences, just like you and I are having, by a computer simulation run by an evil scientist. Orthodoxy addresses the following skeptical argument:

For any person, S:

  1. If S is not in a position to know that she is not a BIV, then she cannot know that she has hands.
  2. S is not in a position to know that she is not a BIV.
  3. S cannot know that she has hands. (inferred from 1 and 2)

If you can't even know that you have hands, then you can't have any empirical knowledge at all.

The philosophical problem is that the argument is logically valid, the premises all seem true, but the conclusion seems false. Where have we gone wrong? Maddy doesn't explicitly formulate an argument for skepticism till appendix B (p. 230), and even then, she does so obliquely. Her standard way of characterizing the problem is that the skeptic poses the "from scratch challenge":

The challenge is to justify her [plain beliefs] without using any of her carefully honed methods for justifying beliefs. (p. 151)

[The] skeptic wants a defense of that belief about the chair that doesn't depend on anything else [one] claims to know. (p. 34)

I don't find this a helpful way to explain the problem. The proper response to such a demand is simply to say: no thank you. But that's not a philosophically adequate response to a logically valid argument the conclusion of which one denies, but the premises of which seem compelling. The point is particularly pressing as the book is intended for a broad audience, who may not be able to read behind the "from scratch challenge". A direct presentation of the argument under discussion might well have helped such readers.

I think Maddy's response to the argument (1-(3) would be to deny (1). In Lecture I, she says that one cannot "rule out" the possibility that one is a BIV (pp. 66, 69). This is obvious upon reflection to sensible people, she claims (p. 69, cf. 33 and 37-8). She does not explain what she means by "ruling out", but there's no hint that it's being used as a technical term (say, in the manner of Gail Stine 1976). So, I'll adopt the natural reading, on which ruling out a possibility is knowing it does not obtain. Maddy does not explicitly say that one cannot know that one is not a BIV, but on my interpretation, it's what she means by saying one cannot "rule it out". However, one does know that one has hands. Sensible people "still feel entitled to their 'reasonable beliefs'", even after admitting they can't "rule out" their being BIVs (p. 70). So according to Maddy, it is obvious upon reflection that premise (1) is false. The only remaining question is why people are initially duped into accepting that premise. That's the question posed at the end of Lecture I (pp. 71-2).

I was disappointed that Maddy didn't address potential objections to her view or discuss promising alternatives. Denying (1) is an unpopular option amongst contemporary philosophers, for good reason. Maddy's idea seems to be that reflective common-sense reaches equilibrium with the thought: "Maybe I'm a BIV, but I have hands." That seems to me, and to most philosophers, clearly incoherent. I couldn't find an indication in the book that there may be a problem here. The question of whether (1) is true has been widely discussed for forty years under the label 'closure'. A footnote to appendix B cites two papers about closure (p. 231 n. 6), but does not formulate an objection to Maddy's proposal.

Maddy's approach manifests a deep disagreement about what's best about philosophy, and what the discipline has to offer a general audience. Contemporary analytic philosophers might try to set readers a good example by considering positions they disagree with, and grappling with arguments against their own views. That's not a priority for therapeutic philosophy.

Lecture I ends with the question: why are people initially fooled into accepting premise (1)? The question is posed on page 72. Maddy presents her answer on pages 194-7. Let me summarize the intervening 120 pages. Most of Lecture II discusses the Argument from Illusion for the view that we only perceive sense-data, not cats or computers. Locke, Berkeley, Hume, Reid and Austin are discussed. The argument "collapses on fairly straightforward inspection," concludes Maddy (p. 141), so it can't be the source of skepticism's draw. Introspection is fallible, just like perception, so there isn't a special skeptical problem about perception (pp. 141-155). Lecture III discusses Moore's "Proof of an External World", then Wittgenstein's rule-following considerations in the Philosophical Investigations, which provide a model for interpreting his remarks in the last third of On Certainty. Some readers might appreciate the historical discussion, but I fear it won't help anyone understand Maddy's solution to the skeptical problem.

Maddy's explanation of the fallacious attraction of (1) is very brief. The following quotations are representative.

[The mistake is to] assume that . . . the only truly acceptable evidence must support the claim for which it's evidence no matter how bizarre the circumstances; it must work without depending on the contingent nature of our perceptual mechanisms, the actual makeup of the world we're perceiving or anything else. (p. 195)

[Confusion arises] when we find ourselves insisting on the type of evidence that would count toward the likelihood of our claim no matter how unusual the circumstances -- and of course this is exactly what's going on . . . when we insist that no evidence is acceptable until extraordinary dreaming has been ruled out and the 'from scratch' challenge has been answered. (p. 197)

Epistemologists disagree about what evidence is, what it takes to possess evidence, what it takes for evidence to support a belief, and whether perceptual knowledge is based on evidence at all. Clearly Maddy thinks that perceptual knowledge is based on evidence, but I would have liked to hear more about the other issues.

Maddy's explanation for the pull of skepticism consists of three claims. First, she asserts that whether our evidence (whatever it is) supports our empirical beliefs depends on whether we are BIVs or are in a knowledge-conducive environment. Second, she says it is natural to mistakenly deny her first claim. And third, she claims that if our evidence supports our empirical beliefs to the same degree whether we're BIVs or not, then it supports them to no degree whatsoever. In sum: if we mistakenly deny her first claim, as is natural, skepticism follows. Maddy's first claim is controversial; it is accepted by some versions of reliabilism, but is rejected by many other approaches. I was unpersuaded by her second claim. Finally, philosophers who deny her first claim typically deny her third. They claim that a BIV's evidence supports the belief that it has hands. Cohen (1984) claims that's obviously so. I would have liked to see more space devoted to defending Maddy's diagnosis.

The book ends with some prescriptions for doing philosophy (to which we will return below). However, two appendices say more about Maddy's conception of evidence and her response to skepticism. Let's start with appendix B.

Maddy claims that we have strong evidence that we have hands, but no evidence at all that we aren't BIVs (pp. 232-3). To explain how this combination is possible, Maddy thinks it is enough to explain why one's evidence that one has hands 'fails to transmit' to one's not being a BIV. Given the obvious entailment, why can't one reason, "I have hands, so I am not a BIV"?[1] As Maddy notes, Crispin Wright (2002, 2004) has a theory of perceptual evidence that explains why not. In Wright's view, one's evidence consists of one's perceptual appearances, which constitute evidence for claims about the external world only because one "already possesses the information" that one is not a BIV. One must already have "ruled out" that one is a BIV in order to form a perceptual belief; hence one can't then use the perceptual belief to "rule out" that one is a BIV. But Maddy denies that one must already have "ruled out" that one is a BIV in order to form a perceptual belief. So, she must reject Wright's explanation of 'transmission-failure'.[2] She does not point this out. She does claim that Wright's explanation is unnecessary.

Whatever evidence Moore has for his hands . . . will fail to transmit to his conclusion for a very simple reason: insofar as the skeptical hypotheses . . . are expressly designed to pose the 'from scratch' challenge, they are by their very nature structurally impervious to evidence. (p. 232)

This merely restates what needs to be explained. That I have hands entails that I am not a BIV. If I have conclusive evidence that I have hands, why is the entailed proposition "structurally impervious to evidence"? Maddy does not explain, and her views are incompatible with Wright's natural account. Moreover, recall that (as far as I can tell) Maddy proposes that one should think, "Maybe I'm a BIV, but I have hands." Even if she could explain why one should not draw the conclusion obviously entailed by the fact one has hands, she would not automatically have explained away the palpable incoherence in the attitudes she recommends.

In appendix A, Maddy addresses the regress of justification.

The Plain Inquirer [Maddy's ideal philosopher] does see herself as duty bound to provide evidence for any of her beliefs. . . . She never reaches anything like the Foundationalist's basic beliefs: even the simplest perceptual or introspective belief can be further defended. (pp. 222-4)

To defend a particular perceptual belief, the Plain Inquirer provides evidence that conditions leading to perceptual error are not met, drawing on other perceptual beliefs, introspective beliefs, and beliefs informed by perceptual science about the conditions under which the senses mislead (pp. 223-4). Beliefs about perceptual science are based on perception, but no objectionable circularity arises as long as we only try to defend one belief at a time (p. 228).

But what has this to do with ordinary people's knowledge? How do you know that you have two hands, and how do you know you are not in pain right now? Most people would be stumped by such questions, but that does not impugn their perceptual and introspective knowledge. In Alston's terms: having a justified belief (a necessary condition for knowing) is one thing, and the activity of justifying the belief is another. (Alston 1983: 84-5, 87-8). Maddy's discussion of "defending" beliefs by "providing" evidence is clearly directed at the activity of defending one's beliefs. But the relevant issue is what it takes to know, because the book aims to explain what's wrong with an argument that nobody knows anything about the external world. I could not find an acknowledgement of this standard distinction in the book. I would have liked Maddy to articulate and defend the connection she sees between knowing something and being able to articulately defend one's belief. I would like to hear whether her diagnosis of BIV skepticism depends on such a connection.

Let's return to the end of Lecture III, where Maddy takes stock of the success of different methods in philosophy (pp. 201-220). 'Good' questions in philosophy arise from particular sciences, and there's no special method for addressing them, other than scientifically informed common sense. 'Bad' philosophical questions are to be dissolved by Austinian ordinary language investigation. What's not fruitful is philosophical 'conceptual analysis'. Maddy alleges that,

For many epistemologists of our day . . . the central question has become -- 'under what conditions is it correct to say that someone knows?' -- and discussion is dominated by commentary on ever-more-complex problem cases, beginning with the Gettier example. (p. 205)

Maddy's complaint has bite against epistemology as practiced thirty years ago, but since Zagzebski (1994) and Williamson (2000) it has become fashionable to pooh-pooh the project of analyzing knowledge. I think of Shope's compendium (1983) as the high-water mark of Gettierology. Maddy's book does not try to give readers a sense of the last forty years of work in epistemology. Contemporary analytic philosophers will think that some insights are thus neglected. Maddy's approach also forgoes the opportunity to show that philosophy is a collective effort, in which a variety of views are developed and tested by people from across the English-speaking world and beyond, including people down the road at one's local university. This inclusive vision might attract readers to the enterprise.

Maddy recommends that epistemology should ditch sterile 'conceptual analysis' to become a thoroughly empirical investigation into "how we manage to acquire reliable information about the world" (p. 214). It isn't clear to me what she thinks this involves, which questions the psychology literature does not answer. In the book, Maddy's engagement with science is limited to observing that according to vision science, the first products of the visual system to hit consciousness represent the world as being three-dimensional. Jennifer Nagel's work provides one model of empirically-informed epistemology (2010, 2012). We take standard questions in epistemology, and try to explain our intuitions as resulting from deep features of our psychology. Let me sketch how this might go in the case of BIV skepticism.

Consider a creature that can think about whether it is making a mistake, say in doing a sum, or in perception. Such a creature has a sophisticated capacity for avoiding false beliefs. If the question comes up, and the creature does not rule out its being mistaken, then it suspends judgement on the matter under investigation. If the creature rules out its being mistaken, then its keeps the relevant belief. Call this ability 'explicit metacognition' (see Proust 2013, Nagel 2014). It would be nice if a general account of the relevant psychological mechanisms explains why we are taken in by the skeptical argument (Jackson 2015). But Maddy recommends believing that one has hands, while one acknowledges that one cannot rule out that one is a BIV deceived on that score. I don't see how explicit metacognition is meant to work if we sometimes keep our beliefs even when we won't rule out their being mistaken. What would be the criterion for suspending judgment? So, I suspect empirical work on explicit metacognition will be inhospitable to Maddy's response to skepticism.


Alston, William. 1983. What's wrong with immediate knowledge? Synthese 55(1): 73-95.

Cohen, Stewart. 1984. Justification and truth. Philosophical Studies 46: 279-295.

Jackson, Alexander. 2015. How you know you are not a brain in a vat. Philosophical Studies 172(10): 2799 -2822.

Nagel, Jennifer. 2010. Epistemic anxiety and adaptive invariantism. Philosophical Perspectives 24: 407-435.

--  -- 2012. Intuitions and experiments: A defense of the case method in epistemology. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 85(3): 495-527.

--  -- 2014. The meanings of metacognition. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 89(3): 710-718.

Proust, Joëlle. 2013. The philosophy of metacognition: Mental agency and self-awareness. Oxford University Press.

Pryor, James. 2004. What's wrong with Moore's argument? Philosophical Issues 14: 349-378.

Shope, Robert. 1983. The analysis of knowing: A decade of research. Princeton University Press.

Stine, Gail. 1976. Skepticism, relevant alternatives, and deductive closure. Philosophical Studies 29(4): 249-261.

Stroud, Barry. 1984. The significance of philosophical scepticism. Oxford University Press.

Williamson, Timothy. 2000. Knowledge and its limits. Oxford University Press.

Wright, Crispin. 2002. (Anti-)sceptics simple and subtle: G.E. Moore and John McDowell. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 65(2): 330-348.

--  --  2004. "Warrant for nothing (and foundations for free)?" Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society Supplemental 78: 167-212.

Zagzebski, Linda. 1994. The inescapability of Gettier problems. The Philosophical Quarterly 44 (174): 6573.


I would like to thank the following for their comments on a previous draft: Andrew Cortens, Brian Kierland, Peter Klein, Ernest Sosa, and Jason Turner.

[1] Some epistemologists think that one can reason this way, e.g. Pryor (2004).

[2] Wright (2002: 340–4) argues that his explanation of transmission-failure is compatible with ‘disjunctivism’, a metaphysical view about the nature of experience. Maddy confuses this for Wright's renouncing his explanation for transmission-failure (p. 232 esp. n. 9).