What Genes Can't Do

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Moss, Lenny, What Genes Can't Do, MIT Press, 2003, 241pp, $34.95 (hbk), ISBN 026213411X.

Reviewed by Jonathan Michael Kaplan , Oregon State University


Lenny Moss’s What Genes Can’t Do is an important contribution to the on-going project of moving the organism back to the center stage of biology, both conceptually and as the primary locus for empirical research. The book is a true example of work in the history and philosophy of biology, moving with ease between historical analyses, contemporary philosophical debates, and recent biological research. Briefly, Moss argues that the language of the genome as the repository of ’information’ and as the ’controller’ of organismal development emerges from a historical conflation of two independently legitimate but jointly incoherent conceptions of “the gene.” This confusion, Moss argues, has had important implications for both basic and applied biological research: it has had, for example, unfortunate (and long standing) consequences for our understanding of cancer.

What Genes Can’t Do is at its best when Moss applies his keen understanding of cellular biology to the problem of understanding development and evolution from a perspective free from the metaphor of the gene as central controller, and indeed, free from the perspective that development must be under any sort of centralized control. This is not, of course, an original project. Many other biologists and philosophers have argued for such a re-articulation before, especially those researchers who identify with “Developmental Systems Theory.” But while Moss is firmly part of the DST project, his arguments seem to emerge from a different tradition than those of most of DST proponents. Unlike most of the usual arguments against the primacy of the gene, Moss’s arguments are steeped in history and the messy details of cellular biology.

This approach is, at first, somewhat off-putting; one searches in vain for familiar arguments and references. For example, it seems unthinkable that a book about the failures of thinking in terms of centralized genetic control should, for example, never cite Lewontin, and that a history of the emergence of (various) gene concept(s) should never address e.g. Dobzhansky’s work. After the shock wears off, however, much of Moss’s work comes across as a refreshing change. Especially in Chapters 3 and 4 (“A Critique of Pure (Genetic) Information” and “Dialectics of Disorder: Normalization and Pathology as Process”), Moss’s arguments are as clear and compelling as any that have come before, and yet are unfamiliar enough to force one to rethink the old debates from the perspective he stakes out.

Moss suggests, with good justification, that work in both contemporary biology and contemporary philosophy of biology has been focused too much on genetics and not enough on the complex (and hence messy) intracellular environment. This misplaced focus, Moss suggests, has meant that most philosophers of biology, and indeed even many practicing biologists, are ignorant of even the basics of the internal structure of cells. Part of his goal in Chapter 3 is to remedy this ignorance, and the chapter does provide an excellent primer on ’wet’ biology. I suspect most readers will find unfamiliar his particular presentation of, for example, SNARES, blebs, and the system of “pancake”-shaped plasma membranes. Moss’s account of the details of the intracellular environment makes for interesting reading, and for most people will serve as a reminder of just how little one knows (even of what little is known) about the internal working of cells. More importantly, Moss shows that even a basic understanding of the internal organization of the cell precludes thinking of DNA as a master-molecule, ’controlling’ cellular development and organization. The internal cellular structure is not ’controlled’ or ’coded’ by DNA; the replication of the internal cellular structure is the result of straightforwardly (if massively complex) physical processes, and there is no place where the ’information’ that the cellular structure ’represents’ is ’stored.’ While this was of course the main point of Oyama’s groundbreaking The Ontogeny of Information (1985/2000), Moss lays out the growing body of evidence in favor of this position carefully, and the examples he chooses to develop are excellent.

But even more significantly, Moss provides evidence that modifications to these complex structures are heritable through non-genetic pathways, and indeed may be implicated in speciation events (pp 96ff). Research focused on the evolutionary significance of “epigenetic” mechanisms of inheritance is becoming increasingly common. However, as there has not yet been a substantive review of the emerging body of work in this field, it remains, for the most part, unfamiliar to people outside the particular fields. Further, work on variations that are heritable but do not primarily involve genetic variation is still somewhat outside the ’mainstream’ of biological research and perhaps for that reason is not taken up with the same vigor as that found in straightforwardly molecular studies. Recent work in Drosophila on heritable variations in chromatin states and the phenotypic effects that can be exposed by reduced heat shock protein activity has received far less attention than the expression of genetic variation through reduced Hsp activity (see Sollars et al 2003, Pigliucci 2003). It is to Moss’s credit that he confronts head-on the claim that genes are uniquely important because they are the only source of heritable phenotypic variation, and shows the claim to be wrong on straightforwardly empirical grounds. (Though here a more detailed analysis of the empirical work, and a more thorough review of previous work on this subject, would have been welcome.)

The practical implications of non-genetic pathways of inheritance and the lack of any centralized control become obvious when Moss turns his attention to cancer research (Chapter 4). Moss presents the evidence that is generally taken to imply that cancer is a genetic disease – a disease that springs from some flaw internal to the cell where the cancer starts – and reveals that in fact the current evidence points in no such direction. Even if there are genetic changes that are associated with ’cancerous’ cells, Moss argues that, in light of current evidence, many genetic changes will be better characterized as effects of the disruption of intercellular organization, not as causes of it (pp. 180). Moss reviews research showing that many of the field disruptions that may precede cancer result in the cells undergoing adaptive responses to intercellular environmental stresses. Cancer, in other words, may well not be the result of errors at the intracellular level spreading to the body, but rather the result of the failure of intercellular organization influencing individual cells (see esp. pp. 166ff). Through these examples from cancer research, Moss argues that new research should focus on the details of inter- and intracellular organization (an organization for which he argues we should use the metaphor of biological “ad-hoc committees,” pp. 188), rather than on the metaphor of a centralized genetic program – a shift in focus that he suggests would give us a more accurate view of the ways in which cancers develop.

These are the strengths of What Genes Can’t Do, and anyone interested in these subjects would do well to read it. There are, though, aspects of the book that are less compelling, or at least compelling to a much smaller group of readers than the material surveyed above. Chapter 1, “Genesis of the Gene,” is the longest chapter of the book, and, unless one shares Moss’s fascination with the history of the gene concept, one is likely to find it slow-going. Moss actually needs to establish very little in this chapter in order to set the stage for the arguments in the rest of the book. As long as he can show that the metaphors of DNA as “information,” “blueprints,” “instructions,” “controllers,” etc., imply a set of empirical claims that are not, and never were, particularly well-supported by research, Moss has given us all the introductory claims needed to underwrite the arguments in the book. But he does not stop here, and continues with an extended and, given the main focus of the book, overly complex discussion of the conceptual confusions that led to the influence these particular metaphors.

Moss suggests that genetic research has been shaped by the conflation of two very specific gene-concepts, which he terms “Gene-P” and “Gene-D”. The “Gene-P” concept emerges (roughly) out of Mendel’s elements, and “genes” in this sense are simply those things associated with statistically significant differences in phenotypic outcomes, whatever they may be and however they may work. In this sense, knowing what version of a “Gene-P” an organism has gives one some information about what the likely phenotypic outcome will be; knowing, for example, what combination of alleles associated with pea-color a pea-plant has permits one to predict what color the plant’s peas will be (ceteris paribus). The “Gene D” concept, on the other hand, refers to particular DNA nucleotide sequences that are used in organismal development. Here, the particular sequence is one of a number of resources that are necessary for development; while differences in the availability or type of this resource can ’make a difference’ developmentally, so too can differences in many other available resources. Here, it makes no sense to speak of the gene as carrying “information” about phenotypic organismal features. Moss suggests that the discovery that DNA was intimately involved with the formation of the myriad proteins involved in organismal development (and cellular function more generally) permitted the conflation of the two concepts; “genes” became both nucleotide sequences and predictors of phenotypic differences, though there is no one entity to which both concepts refer.

Despite the thoroughness of the first chapter, however, Moss’s account of the history of these concepts, and of the generation of the confusion, is not wholly convincing. I agree that there is massive confusion in the literature between, e.g., ’genes’ as something like markers associated with particular differences in phenotypes in particular environments and ’genes’ as DNA sequences involved in development more generally (see, e.g., Kaplan & Pigliucci, 2000). And I’m sympathetic to the “Gene-P”/”Gene-D” distinction as one important element of the various gene-concept distinctions one might make. But I remain unconvinced that the “Gene-P” concept can be so neatly separated from the “Gene-D” concept historically. For example, I tend to read Morgan’s (and other early Drosophilists’) claim to the effect that “the future of genetics [lies] in its connections with development and evolution” (from Kohler 1994, pp. 177) as implying that, despite the technical limitations of the day, those early researchers hoped that the ’genes’ they were discovering would at least provide inroads to work in developmental and evolutionary biology. And later, the work with the period gene in Drosophila (Benzer, Hall, etc.) seems to me to have been wrapped up from its very early days in searches for biological meaning (and evolutionary significance) – not just for a gene-phenotype relationship that happened to hold in a particular population of fruit-flies in a particular laboratory environment (see Weiner 1999). If this is right, then ’gene for’ talk has been, since it’s earliest days, wrapped up in the functional and hence evolutionary significance of the genes in question. Done well, it is possible that this kind of ’gene for’ talk is neither strictly “Gene-P” nor “Gene-D” and yet avoids at least most of the pitfalls of conflation that Moss points towards (see Kaplan and Pigliucci 2000).

There are, then, elements of the ’gene’ concept that Moss’s account misses, and historical turns that Moss doesn’t address. Of course, as I have said, this isn’t a problem for Moss’s more general project in the balance of his book; indeed, it wouldn’t be a problem for the book at all if Moss hadn’t given his historical account the significance attending a lengthy chapter on the subject.

While the historical picture Moss presents in the first chapter seems to be too specific and detailed, the analysis in the second chapter, focusing on the rhetorical force of the metaphors surrounding contemporary genetics, seems simply out of place. To be sure, Moss’s examination of Schrödinger’s argument for the necessity of (at least something like) DNA to act as repository of information to guide development is well-presented. Moss argues that Schrödinger’s reasons for thinking that biological stability needed to be grounded in an information-carrying ’crystal’ were, while not exactly absurd, in fact, mistaken. There does not, in fact, have to be any one source for continued order, and, as it turns out, biological systems ’resist’ entropy at many different levels and in many different ways. However, this very specific case is discussed without any of the nuanced historical context that would be of interest to, say, historians of biology, and for readers simply interested in alternatives to the ’standard’ view of the gene as information, the discussion does little or no substantive work.

As I noted earlier, most of Chapter 3 is an exploration of the ways in which aspects of biological order are replicated and maintained, and here Moss begins to hit his stride. The details of these processes clearly point away from the metaphor of ’information’ – there is no place where, for example, ’information’ about which intracellular membranes go where is ’stored’. Again, the biological details are fascinating and, I think, utterly convincing. But in addition, Moss appeals, unnecessarily, I think, to work by ’chaos’ theorists on the creation and maintenance of stable complex cycles in non-linear systems. Here his use of Kauffman’s work seems rather thin. In all fairness, Moss never claims that the approach Kauffman recommends is sound, nor that the results Kauffman (and others) have obtained are anything more than suggestive. Indeed, Moss criticizes Kauffman’s assumptions as unrealistic, and Kauffman’s vision of biology as too ’dry’ and information-oriented (see pp 102-106). As with the discussion of Schrödinger, the point of going into some detail on the work of Kauffman (and other ’chaos’ theorists) is rather mysterious. There isn’t anything wrong with Moss’s analysis, but again, it seems out of place in an otherwise fairly technical and non-speculative presentation.

With respect to audience then, while the first chapter may not appeal to people for whom the History and Philosophy of Science means mostly philosophy, I have no doubt that historians of biology will find it worthy of careful attention; indeed, I suspect that historians will find the historical discussions that come up throughout What Genes Can’t Do to be of special interest. Philosophers of biology, and most practicing biologists, should pay particular attention to the biological details and philosophical analysis offered in Chapters 3 and 4. Moss’s analysis in these chapters points towards new directions for both empirical research and philosophical exploration, and shows that the continued resistance to these new directions is increasingly unmotivated.


Kaplan, J.M. and M. Pigliuicci (2001) “Genes ’For’ Phenotypes: A modern history view” Biology and Philosophy 16(2): 189-213.

Kohler, R.E. (1994) Lords of the Fly: Drosophila Genetics and the Experimental Life. Chicago. Chicago University Press.

Oyama, S. (1985/2000) The Ontogeny of Information (revised edition). Durham, N.C. Duke University Press.

Pigliucci, M. (2003) “Epigenetics is back!” Cell Cycle 2(1): 33-35.

Sollars, V. et al (2003) “Evidence for an epigenetic mechanism by which Hsp90 acts as a capacitor for morphological evolution” Nature Genetics 33(January): 70-74.

Weiner, J (1999) Time, Love, Memory: A Great Biologist and His Quest for the Origins of Behavior. New York. Knopf.