What Is a People?

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Alain Badiou, Pierre Bourdieu, Judith Butler, et al., What Is a People?, Jody Gladding (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2016, 152pp., $24.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231168762.

Reviewed by Janae Sholtz, Alvernia University


This collection of essays will be of interest to those engaged with the contemporary problem of how to conceive the reinvigoration of the political imagination. The authors seek to reclaim the concept of a "people" for its political efficacy by carefully extracting the concept from its fraught history. The tension inherent in this recuperative project is foregrounded in Bruno Bosteels' introduction, in which he characterizes each of the contributors as walking the line between positive development of an emancipatory role and negative delimitation of the concept's appropriation within totalizing politics or state control. Bosteels offers a preemptive warning: "The fundamental decision to be made … is whether or not we take this logic of exclusion to be capable of erecting insurmountable obstacles on the path to the continued use of the people as a political category today." Obviously, this question, though legitimate, is somewhat rhetorical given its situation in the introduction of six authors who make the concept their main concern. Their positive task then is to articulate what should give validity to claimants to the "we"? In other words, what legitimates a people? Common themes presented in the texts include the presence and articulation of need or suffering, and disaffectedness towards state power, as well as a general advocacy of openness and sensitivity towards revision.

Bosteels identifies the unifying wager of these texts: that the divisions and exclusions that keep the people from ever being "one" are part of its political efficacy; his analysis is quite rich, and should be considered among the essays themselves. Offering a brief exegesis of Rousseau's The Social Contract, he makes the provocative point that one finds in the hollowed out spaces of Rousseau's social contract the trajectories of 18th century politics, in the figures of Kant, Hegel, and Marx. He develops this claim by referencing Althusser's critique of the inherent redundancy implicit to the act of political becoming in Rousseau's social contract account. The inherent contradiction here is that the individuals and the general will are hypothetically contracting with one another, but this community apparently does not exist until the act of association. Thus, the contract is unequal to the task of explaining originary association. Althusser sees this as an irresolvable tension. The individual is under reciprocal commitment as a member of the sovereign to private individuals and as a member of the state towards the sovereign. Yet the issue of fidelity is quickly covered over (to sovereign or individuals) under the singular name of the people. This hesitation illuminates two major strands in political philosophy, those of Kant and Hegel: respectively, obedience to the law as an act of autonomy and morality or anticipation of the Nation as a totality, a moment of Objective spirit. This split in commitment also announces Marx's critique of the limits of modern politics (that of man and citizen, political and human emancipation) (9). What this analysis ultimately signifies for Bosteels is the inescapable play of difference at the heart of this category. The twist is that the fundamental openness or lack of closure is actually its strength, and what is retrievable, conceivably, by the figures within this volume. Such is the case for Jacques Rancière and Alain Badiou, Althusser's students no less, for whom this internal difference "is not an impediment but rather the very key to unlock its true political effectiveness" (11).

Bosteels explains that, for Rancière, political efficacy can be wrought from the dissonance inherent to gros mots -- rather than judging them obsolete or overly laden, these are spaces of possible creativity and invention. The "discrepancy inherent in categories such as the people is precisely what offers a place for political inventiveness" (13). Political articulation proves the non-essentialist contingency of social groups and also challenges us to create, argue for, interpret and act them out. This is why this question of the people becomes so tantalizing: if each of these figures seeks to operate within the paradigm of non-essentiality, then they are involved in a similar process of creativity and critique that is and must always be timely, or, as Bosteels attributes to Judith Butler, "according to the singular demands of the situation at hand" (14). Bosteels highlights the overlapping insistence that there is never one people, but always a plurality, which implies positive instability as well as openness -- to historical trends, to social, material, and political developments. Thus, Bosteels admirably sets up the project herein: a creative reinvigoration of the category.

Bosteels briefly notes the conspicuous absence of reference to tradition of post-Heideggerian French thinkers who attempt to deconstruct the categories of people (Volk) and community (Gemeinschaft), in reaction to Heidegger's invocation of Volk as related to authenticity, destiny, belonging, which was all the more disturbing given its signification as a code word for the closed communities of Nazi Germany. Bosteels' inclusion here and explicit allusion to the obliqueness of the references to this tradition seems like an invitation to consider the ways that this conception of a people has cast a powerful shadow and is informing the impetus to reconceive or resuscitate the concept of a people. Though I believe the implication is that these thinkers wish to be more pragmatic and materialist, rather than theoretical, the omission is rather puzzling given the rich dialogue that has been developed around this issue already.

The first essay is Badiou's "Twenty-Four Notes on the Uses of the Word 'People.'" In these notes, Badiou addresses the ambiguous connotations of 'a people,' delineating between the conditions under which the people indicates a legitimate nod to emancipation and empowerment, and when it is galvanized by fascist or populist regimes. Rather than proceeding by way of strict enumeration of each note, the aim here is to highlight the major trends that Badiou seeks to develop -- where he seeks to unweave the positive from the negative, the foreclosing language of exclusion from that of emancipatory spirit. Rather than advocating for the theoretical neutralization of the term, Badiou insists that each rendition of a people be oriented within a particular context, as it is always coded positively or negatively with regard to real relations to and against the state. In the two negative senses, reference to a people is either an exclusionary fictive identity or a pacificatory strategy, while the two positive senses developed by Badiou demand the demise of both the entrenched state and the 'official people.'

Generally, Badiou notes that people accompanied by an adjective of national identity is fraught with problematic assumptions of purity, truth, or originality, though the exception to this is for the purposes of national liberations, i.e. the Algerian people or the Palestinian people. When imperial colonial forces prefer to speak of tribes or ethnic groups, re-appropriating the term has a liberating valence. As soon as that liberating moment has passed, the value of any nationalistic usage rescinds, especially when considering the diaspora of workers brought on by global capitalism. In other words, this first usage is either inherently problematic or short-lived -- either indicating the inert category of state or a category of war and political process (24). Effectively, the refusal of state legitimacy is the criteria by which any legitimate use of a people emerges. Thus, the liberating view of a people always implies a challenge to, and even demise of, the state; it is a matter of a new, emerging people, a minority detachment from the state, which does not represent but becomes, out of peripheral figures that the state ignores, exploits, or exiles from its complacent center, while maintaining a complacent mass, a false people, that represents and benefits from the dominant ideology.

Pierre Bourdieu's etymological piece, "You Said 'Popular'?" examines the relation between the popular and the people. He asks, is it as simple as what belongs to, or is created or used by, the people, or is there inherently a schism that the popular denotes between the people, as an underclass mass, and the bourgeois. The popular indicates that which is distinguished from the legitimate or proper -- as within language, the popular is slang, familiar, or "common language," eschewed by the cultivated. As a term that denotes class division, the popular is the means of that manipulation, all the stronger because the term safeguards itself, as any criticism is seen as "symbolic aggression" (33) against those to which it belongs. Through indeterminate extension of the popular or working class to refer to indigenous workers just as easily as rural populations, lowlifes, and small business owners, "anyone can […] unconsciously manipulate that extension to adjust it to one's own interests, prejudices, or social fantasies" (34). The network of associations is thus relational and filled with uncertainties that speak to the "confused representations that social subjects engender" (35), yet Bourdieu, the sociologist, considers this incoherence positively, as a valuable tool for understanding the ordinary knowledge and perceptions within the social world, and he examines how the layers and relations of the imaginary proletariat indicate an inherent plurality and inevitability of partial coherence implicated in the term.

Bourdieu claims that the category of 'popular language' operates within a "dualist taxonomy that structures the social world according to high and low" (37), reflecting the "essence of the dominant vision." To resist this opposition of standard to popular language, we must return to the model of linguistic production to rediscover the extreme diversity that exists in speech, by attending to sociological factors such as sex, social and ethnic origins, offering a (dated) interpretation of slang and the culture of the disaffected vis-à-vis gender and class considerations. Nevertheless, Bourdieu's point about language is that it is shot through with power relations, condemning those who do not possess or revolt against legitimate competence "to a desperate effort toward correction or toward silence" (42), and even these deviations/transgressions are caught within the confines of the limits of the dominant economy and class. Bourdieu gestures towards a sociological project -- a program of methodological observation to consider the most significant scenarios of linguistic production of speakers lacking linguistic capital (44) as well as the inclinations and aptitudes which situate these in relation to the market-controlled standard. Returning to the issue of the "people" or the "popular", Bourdieu suggests that this diversity of linguistic productions, and perhaps because of the occlusion of it, has the effect of allowing "all those who feel they have a right or duty to speak of the 'people' [to] find an objective medium for their interests or their fantasies" (48).

Next, and as a modern rejoinder to Bourdieu's emphasis on the socio-linguistic significance of language, Butler's "'We, the People': Thoughts on Freedom of Assembly" challenges the priority of language in the constitution of a people, claiming that the "we" is enacted by the assembly of bodies before being spoken. The freedom of assembly (or association), rather than a right bestowed upon individuals or the populace, is actually the precondition of politics, and the populace, or popular will, that it invokes always remains as an excess of the electoral process and transfer of sovereignty to these representatives. Butler refers to a kind of anarchist energy of popular sovereignty that is the condition of democratic rule, because of the very fact that this energy is never fully contained. Popular sovereignty is a way of forming a people, through a self-designatory act that is autogenetic rather than representative. The speech acts declaring the "we" of assembly are not merely a declaration of unity but an act of contestation that institutes a set of debates about who and what the "we" are, constituting an integral mechanism of the democratic process to resist inertia and illustrate the constant necessity for revision and critique. "Every regime is dependent upon popular sovereignty being given if it hopes to base its legitimacy on something other than coercion" (53).

At the same time, Butler emphasizes that the reference to the illocutionary actually misses that these illocutions do not operate as a spontaneous coming into being through some kind of speech in unison, but that this illocution of 'we the people' is actually predicated on the embodied performative exercise of assembly. Thus, Butler wants us to remember any enunciation, whether in text or uttered, "presupposes an embodied and plural sociality" (56), which is irreducible to a purely cognitive, conceptual moment. Focusing on the bodily dimension of assembly allows us to recognize the demands as extending from a common recognition of need and interdependence, an ever-increasing precarity of life, and to view these acts of resistance as rooted in real bodily conditions. Butler's insistence on this visibility as a precondition of justice is particularly powerful in explaining the emotional charge and sense of urgency involved in the act of assembly, that it is a matter of "working against oblivion" and a demand for "equality in the face of increasing inequality" (59). Perhaps, as Olson remarks in his conclusion, Butler overstates the necessity of material presence. Thus, this might be an occasion to also develop a more complex account of embodiment with regard to spatialization made possible through new technologies that allow for various virtual modes of assembly.

Georges Didi-Huberman's "To Render Sensible" also focuses upon the plurality implicit in the always partial, thus multiple, representations of the "people." Resisting the logic of identity allows us to break open the concept to the reality of coexistent peoples and to foster a critical awareness of patterns of recognition and non-recognition. Drawing from Pierre Rosanvallon's tripartite distinction of imaginary peoples (opinion, nation, and emotion-peoples), Didi-Huberman argues against the description of the pathetic mode of an emotion-people as fleeting and lacking content, contending instead that "emotions, like images, are inscriptions of history, its crystals of legibility" (69), thereby introducing the relationship between historicity and visibility, a theme that resonates with Butler's project. Using Benjamin's dialectical conception of the image to explore the legibility of history, in which flashes, memories, and images are symptoms that open up the tradition of the oppressed, Didi-Huberman develops this imperative: to give "worthy representation to the nameless of history" (73), and by engaging the memory and desires of the peoples, to reveal "the configuration of an emancipated future" (71). This rendering sensible of history confronts conformism, revealing the mobility and plurality too often covered over in the march of dominant representations. Didi-Huberman refers to this as lifting the lid to reveal possible gaps where lives have fallen through the cracks of historical visibility. For Didi-Huberman, the essence of the political is that, through its dissensus, it demonstrates these gaps, and, through this dialectic, "we ourselves, before these flaws or symptoms, become 'sensible' to the life of the peoples" (85) and able to construct an inclusive, emancipatory politics.

Sadri Khiari's "The People and the Third People" addresses the question of belonging indicative of being recognized (by the state) as part of the people as a matter of privilege, assimilation, and exclusion, which is always constituted through a certain configuration of power relations, specifically, "capitalist and colonial modernity" (89). He enumerates three notions that determine the way in which the concept of a people is deployed: the nation, citizenship/sovereignty, and the subordinate classes. These indices can be used to analyze the plurality of real forms of peoples, by examining their permeability, the subordination of one to another, etc. Khiari quickly revises this triptych by adding a fourth term that he claims is indispensable for understanding the true condition of power relationships; that is, race, which Khiari defines as "the relationship between domination and resistance to oppression that exists between racialized human groups" (90) and which can be charted by the locals of privilege. Khiari proposes that French national ideology, and the 'republican pact,' which ensues from it, is constructed around a universalizing mission that seeks to mask racial hierarchies by separating out the true French citizens from indigenous subjects of colonies, but even within the so-called French citizenry, there is another division between those who belong, i.e. are white, European, and Christian, from all others, those who do not 'belong'. He calls these the third-people, which is unfortunately, and perplexingly, given no further conceptual development. Khiari's main concern is to address the experience of those who are "colonized from within" and offer a new political vision, as an alternative to leftist politics which has fallen prey to assimilative logic of liberal globalization, which does not merely pay lip service to notions of plurality and difference, but engages in decolonial practices that break the illusion of universality by acknowledging conditions of privilege and power that drive the oppression (and racialization) of peoples. Khiari's essay also pivots on the problem of visibility and recognition, thus it could be productive to pair with the former in fleshing out the actualities of a "third people" which is excessive to, rather than merely constructed within, the paradigm of capitalist and colonial discourse.

The final contribution, Rancière's 'The Populism That Is Not to Be Found," though short, is strikingly powerful in its incisive timeliness. The author teases out a rather bleak political landscape in which the specter of populism is seen as a rhetorical tool to cement power relations and the status quo. "The term 'populism' does not serve to characterize a defined political force. On the contrary, it benefits from the amalgams that it allows between political forces that range from the extreme right to the radical left" (102). Because the "people does not exist" it can be constructed by privileging certain modes of assembly, traits, capacities which are distilled into an image of a blind mass or pack hostile to governance and enemy to 'others,' the fear of which can be mobilized solidify state control. Optimistically, by pointing out this political manipulation, Rancière underlines the fissure in the logic that there is no other choice, thereby opening the possibility of a different political future.

The conclusion provides a helpful summary and selective criticism centering on the fact that the force of the normative is obscured or missing from much of the discussion. Kevin Olson's point is that for the people to become politically significant, it has to adopt a normative mantle. The problem is that each of the authors intuitively resists such language and thinking. Incompleteness, mobility, fragility, and performative possibility are qualities that these authors emphasize as important for maintaining a kind of ethical openness with regard to the conceptuality of the "people." The juxtaposition of these ideas at the end serves to underscore what Bosteels has previously highlighted, that the concept of a people must be approached with extreme subtlety and caution; as soon as the concept is hypostasized and invested with too much normative power it loses its politically transformative efficacy and becomes a tool of conformity, a balancing act of which these thinkers are well aware. The merit of these essays is that they do not get mired in a purely theoretical, deconstructive practice, but instead offer concrete methods for extracting the beneficial schisms and occluded differences that can serve as platforms for new political visions.