What Is a Person? Rethinking Humanity, Social Life, and the Moral Good from the Person Up

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Christian Smith, What Is a Person? Rethinking Humanity, Social Life, and the Moral Good from the Person Up, University of Chicago Press, 2010, 518pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226765914.

Reviewed by Raymond Martin, Union College


In What is a Person?, sociologist Christian Smith fashions an approach inspired by critical realism, personalism, and an anti-foundationalist phenomenological epistemology to advance a robustly inclusive account of the human person. His account, while heavily metaphysical, is also phenomenological and empirical. Central to it is his claim that human persons are real, objective, albeit emergent, entities, a view that informs virtually everything that he writes in this book, including a major section in which he critically engages leading sociological theories and approaches including social constructionism, network structuralism, and the dominant variables approach. He ends with two chapters in which he tries to overturn the idea central to so much contemporary thought that facts are one thing, values another and that the main priority of science, including sociology, ought to be to get the facts right. In place of this, he offers an account of persons that is both normative and teleological.

In spite of this book's title, Smith's question is not what is a person, but what is a human person. He does not address the issue of whether there might be non-human persons. He says that human persons are always embodied, but are not identical with their bodies. But, then, even though his approach is heavily metaphysical, he does not go on to fully clarify the metaphysical relationship between a human person and his or her body. For instance, he does not consider whether in principle a human person could leave the human organism in which he or she is embodied and become embodied in something else, say by being teleported or having a brain transplant, perhaps the main issue that divides animalists, who are proponents of one of the most prominent philosophical theories of human personhood, from their critics.[1]

One thing Smith does say about the relationship between persons and their bodies is that while his account of persons "emphasizes the intangible, mental, subjective, 'spiritual' aspects of human being, none of that ever exists apart from the corporeal materiality of living flesh and blood" (p. 62). He also says that human persons are always sexed and gendered. He does not elaborate on these pronouncements or try to justify them. Hence, it is unclear whether they imply that human persons could not survive their bodily deaths in a way that is free of "living flesh and blood." Various people, including some of the Neo-Platonic Church Fathers, have claimed that they could. Smith's pronouncements seem to imply that there could not be an alien person, if it were not made of "flesh and blood," or an android person. In his view, no flesh and blood, no human-like subjective life. So much for the extensive debates over those issues. Unfortunately, Smith does not say how he knows that flesh and blood are required for a human-like subjectivity.

Smith is adamant that human persons are real, objective, albeit emergent, entities. He believes that emergence is "the counter to reductionism" (p. 38). Like many other emergence theorists he also claims that reality is ontologically stratified and that entities at different levels of reality causally interact with entities above and below them. Failure to acknowledge these truths and their implications seems to be what he thinks is primarily wrong with reductionism, as in the following passage:

objective nature is not flat but stratified, existing on multiple though connected levels, each of which operates according to its own characteristic dynamics and processes. We live in a multilayered reality, it turns out, and our framework for understanding reality must be attuned to that fact … Reductionist scientific explanations are typically misguided and should be resisted, because they artificially flatten what is a stratified reality -- critical realism is thus strongly antireductionistic. The best way to understand and explain something is usually at the level of reality at which it exists, not by reductionistically decomposing it into its component parts at a lower level… . The combination or interaction of two or more phenomena at one level often gives rise through emergence to new phenomena at a higher level … that are more than the sum of the parts from which they are made. (p. 95)

So, one question is whether Smith has the metaphysics right and another is whether, even if he does have it right, it is as relevant to empirical theorizing as he imagines.

In my view, it's impossible to say whether Smith has the metaphysics right because his explanation of emergence is so thin that it raises more questions than it answers. Currently there are many varieties of both epistemological and metaphysical emergence theories and a quite extensive body of technical debate over many of them.[2] I have no idea who has the upper hand in these debates, but for reasons I will explain I am skeptical that the outcome should make much difference to empirical theorizing, at least of the sort Smith considers.

So, what are Smith's criteria of emergence? He says that what makes something an emergent entity (or property) is that it is "greater than the sum of its parts." By this he sometimes seems to mean that there is something emergent if a collection of things does not merely consist in the parts out of which it is composed but in those parts in relationship to each other. At other times he seems to mean that in addition the parts in relationship to each other have to give rise to novel "causal capacities."

Real world collections seem always to satisfy this first criterion since the parts of a real world collection always exist in spatial and temporal relations to each other. For example, the stars that comprise the Big Dipper obviously exist in certain spatial and temporal relations to each other. Moreover, the Big Dipper's looking from a certain perspective to certain sorts of observers like a dipper is a necessary causal condition for those sorts of observers to have the visual experiences they have from these perspectives. Hence, the stars out of which the Big Dipper is composed standing in the relationships to each other that they do may also give rise to novel causal capacities. Is the Big Dipper then, on Smith's view, an emergent entity? A reason for thinking that it's not is that the stars are not interacting much with each other. However, Smith claims that Monet's painting Water Lilies, which Smith says "consists of nothing more than dabs of different colored paint on a canvas" (p. 36), is an emergent entity, and the dabs of paint seem not to be interacting with each other any more than the stars in the Big Dipper. So, perhaps the Big Dipper does satisfy Smith's criteria. For whatever it is worth, intuitively it seems very doubtful, at least to me, that the Big Dipper really is an emergent entity.

The only examples Smith gives of real world collections that in his view are not emergent entities are chicken feed and lawn fertilizer. The reason he gives that chicken feed, which he says is a mixture of soybean meal, cracked corn, fish meal, and other ingredients, is not an emergent entity is that "nothing new of importance happens in the mixing." But, of course, something new of importance must happen in the mixing or else chicken farmers would not pay good money for chicken feed. However, what's new may simply be that the ingredients are mixed together with each other more or less uniformly. But being so mixed might be important. Smith continues:

The content of the sack does not possess properties over and above those of its distinct ingredients when separated and placed next to one another. By feeding the mixed ingredients of the sack to chickens, for example, compared to feeding the same proportion of the ingredients separately, chicken farmers are not able to double their egg production. (p. 36)

But, first, the content of the sack does possess properties over and above those of its ingredients when these ingredients are not placed next to one another. And, second, since to say that the contents are "placed next to one another" means that they are brought into certain spatial and temporal relations to one another, one would think that they may well make for a whole which is "greater than the sum of its parts." Imagine, for instance, which could be true for all I know, that it matters to egg production whether chickens eat all of the ingredients together at the same time rather than eat them separately at different times, just as it matters whether one takes certain medicines with or without an eight ounce glass of water. If it did matter whether chickens eat all of the ingredients together at the same time, would the chicken feed then constitute an emergent entity? Does the medicine + glass of water constitute an emergent entity?

Quite apart from how such questions are answered, Smith does not so much argue that there are emergent entities and properties as simply assert it. In spite of extensive philosophical debates over emergence theories, it seems to be so obvious to Smith that there are emergent entities and that human persons are among them that in advocating his version of this view and then hitting reductionists over the head with it he tends to get carried away, as in the following remarks:

To a reductionist hurricanes are nothing more than air and water vapor in particular energy states. But as anyone who has ever lived though a hurricane knows, hurricanes are real weather-system entities possessing real emergent properties that are irreducible to the sum total of their constituent parts. Reductionism misses the most important facts about hurricanes because it is blind to emergence. (p. 29)

Smith may (or may not) be right about hurricanes and reductionism. But, of course, contrary to what he claims, many people, myself included, who have lived through hurricanes do not know that hurricanes possess real emergent properties! How could one know this without entering into the highly technical debates in the literature? Would that metaphysics were this simple!

A glaring problem with Smith's account of emergence is that to make a convincing case for emergent entities (and properties) based on relational composition it must be only some forms of relational composition that result in emergent entities, not all forms. Smith seems in his discussion of his chicken feed example to want to go in this direction, but he does not address the question of what these more metaphysically potent forms of relational composition might be, other than to say that for there to be an emergent entity the whole must have "nontrivial causal capacities" that the parts minus the relationships in which they stand to each other do not. But, as we have seen, that criterion seems to be too easily satisfied.

As emphatic as Smith is about emergent entities, he is almost as emphatic about his more general contention that reality is pervasively stratified. The heart of this more general claim, as he articulates it, is not only that things exist and have causal capacities at many "levels," but that they can, and often do, exert causal power on other things that are above and below them. This has been a pretty standard feature over the years of metaphysical versions of emergence theories. Smith does not then go on to discuss what the mechanisms are for things exercising their causal capacities on other things at different levels, if indeed there even are mechanisms for their doing this. But without specifying the mechanisms, how can one be so confident about the claimed causal interactions? Smith writes:

The physical human brain, for example, gives rise through emergence to capacities for higher-level affective and mood experiences including, for instance, depression. And extended depression, we have come to learn, has the causal capacity to influence the physical operations of the brain. (p. 41)

So, the brain creates depression, which exists at a higher level than the brain, and then depression in turn affects the brain, which is at a lower level. Although I do not really understand what all of this level-talk means, even if one were to concede for the sake of argument that the brain-depression relationship is as Smith says that it is, how would this help us to understand better how changes in the brain cause depression or how depression affects the brain? As far as I can tell, the answer to this question is that Smith's levels of reality metaphysics would not help at all in understanding this. Hence, I'm skeptical whether, even if Smith has the metaphysics right, it is as relevant to empirical theorizing as he imagines.

This problem of failing to discuss the mechanisms of causal influence is not a side issue, but goes right to the heart of Smith's answer to the question, "What is a (human) person?", which is that a human person, at least one who has developed normally, is:

a conscious, reflexive, embodied, self-transcending, center of subjective experience, durable identity, moral commitment, and social communication who -- as the efficient cause of his or her own responsible actions and interactions -- exercises complex capacities for agency and intersubjectivity in order to develop and sustain his or her own incommunicable self in loving relationships with other personal selves and with the nonpersonal world. (p. 61)

There is not space here to go into everything about this definition that I find puzzling. So, I will focus on what, in Smith's view, is most important in it, which is that a human person is a center of subjective experience.

Smith writes that a human center of subjective experience is not to be understood as human capacities, but as something that organizes and directs human capacities:

The capacities are merely a list of various abilities, powers, or potentialities. With emergent personhood, however, dependent upon their interactive relations, a new and unique center of subjective experience has being. That center acts as the personal core or heart that integrates, coordinates, and directs those capacities in new, purposeful ways. The exercise of each capacity is then connected to and guided by that personal center. Without the center there is no person. The personal center emerges as a distinct reality with novel properties and capacities that help constitute the real person. (p. 79)

I don't know of a single neural scientist whose theories support this part of Smith's account. It would be nice to know what evidence he thinks exists that there are "personal centers" that function in this way. It would also be nice to know where he thinks these centers are located and how he thinks they "integrate, coordinate, and direct" one's human capacities. Smith does not consider such questions. But if one cannot say more about where one's center is located, if indeed it even has a location, and about the mechanisms it employs to integrate, coordinate, and direct human capacities, if indeed there even are such mechanisms, how can one be so sure that one's center exists and does what he says it does?

Smith's answer, it seems, is that one just can be sure, and that's all there is to it:

But what exactly is a personal center? That is not easy to say. I could talk about brains and consciousness and subconsciousness for a long time. But at some point in the process of reasoned exploration of personhood, personal centers are ineffable… . But that does not make them any less real or important. (p. 79)

In my opinion, Smith does not talk about the relationship between brains, consciousness, the subconsciousness, and personal centers for nearly enough time. In fact, he hardly talks about it at all. I agree with him that many issues in science and philosophy ultimately terminate in mystery. My difficulty in accepting his account of personal centers is not that it terminates in mystery, but that he arrives there so quickly.

I remain skeptical about whether, even if Smith has the metaphysics right, it is as useful as he thinks it is to import it into the construction and evaluation of empirical theories. My suspicion is that in most cases if an empirical theory can be effectively criticized, then one neither needs nor is helped by invoking metaphysics to criticize it. To take just one example from the book, consider Smith's criticism of David Sloan Wilson's attempt to give explanatory primacy to evolutionary theory:

Wilson's commitment to unify all human knowledge under evolutionism's explanatory supremacy ends up reading to me as a compressing, totalizing project. It's all about reproduction -- literature, religion, philosophy, media, whatever. Here is where Wilson goes off track. For to believe in the unity and coherence of reality, as Wilson and I do, does not commit one to having to find a single analytic framework that interprets and explains every aspect and dimension of reality by reference to one master casual mechanism. In a critical realist world -- the world I believe we actually inhabit -- reality is stratified; higher levels are emergent from lower; and different causal properties, mechanisms, and dynamics exist and operate at various levels according to concerns appropriate to their own levels and not to others. (p. 203)

Smith's main criticism of Wilson's explanatory project is that it does not work because it is overly simple. Does one need all of Smith's metaphysical artillery to make this point? Does his metaphysical artillery even help to make it? One would think that it would be enough to show on non-metaphysical grounds, which should not be hard to do in this case, that not as much as Wilson thinks can be explained by appeal to evolutionary theory actually can be explained by appeal to it. All one needs for this critique is a careful, critical look at the evidence Wilson gives for his explanatory claims, not a levels-of-reality metaphysics.

Smith, in the middle of his book, devotes about 200 pages to criticizing sociological approaches to theorizing that he does not like, especially certain versions of sociological social constructionism, network structuralism, and variables social science. It often seemed to me that, in this part of his book, those criticisms that were not dependent on Smith's metaphysics were plausible. It also seemed to me that his invocations of metaphysics to back up his criticisms were ineffectual, even if one were to grant that his metaphysics is correct. Interestingly the mistake is not just Smith's. Some of his sociologist antagonists (e.g., Bruce Mayhew, pp. 242f) also do not seem to realize that the ontological status of a putative thing and how that thing's behavior is most usefully explained are separate issues. But I leave it to others who know more sociology than I do to assess Smith's non-metaphysical criticisms in this part of his book.

One reason Smith seems to invoke metaphysics to criticize empirical theories when the metaphysics is neither needed nor helpful is that he consistently conflates the questions of whether higher-level explanations can be "reduced" to lower level ones with that of whether putative higher-level entities, properties, and causal relationships can be so "reduced." Many theorists with less effusive metaphysical commitments than Smith's, myself included, would happily concede that explanations in psychology cannot in general be reduced in a meaningful way to explanations in biology, which in turn cannot be reduced to explanations in chemistry, which in turn cannot be reduced to explanations in physics. But it does not follow from this that there are entities, properties, and causal relationships in psychology over and above those in biology, and in biology over and above those in chemistry, and in chemistry over and above those in physics. It's an interesting question whether there are such higher-level entities, properties, and causal relationships. It might be true that there are, but it does not follow from the point about explanations that there are. That is, even if such higher-level explanations cannot be reduced to lower-level explanations, it still could be that the entities, properties, and causal relationships acknowledged in physics are all that there are. Or Smith might be right that reality is stratified in the way that he imagines. Even so, his failure to separate the question of whether explanations can be reduced from that of whether entities, properties, and causal relationships can be reduced is partly what undermines his making a convincing case for the metaphysical stratification that is central to his view.

In the final two chapters of his book, Smith addresses what he takes to be the normative and teleological dimensions of human persons, along the way rejecting the division between facts and values. All of this material seems to me to be deeply questionable. To consider just one example, he claims that persons essentially have human dignity and that they have it at every stage of their being persons. They have it, he says, not because of their capacities, but regardless of their capacities. So, for instance, they have dignity even if they are malformed or comatose. Smith says that even most of those who are not malformed or comatose are "broken" or at least incomplete. Hence, most people have not fully realized their personhood, which, he says, is one's natural goal -- that is, what everyone should be striving to do.

Smith gives several examples of people who are broken or incomplete. These include people with serious mental illness, such as schizophrenia. It would be hard to argue with most of his examples. Unfortunately, though, he does not go on to explain how he distinguishes in general between broken and unbroken humans and between incomplete and complete humans. This omission raises unanswered questions as well as ominous worries. The idea that there is a natural human condition and that humans who deviate from it are therefore unnatural and in being unnatural are defective and/or immoral has been used historically to denigrate people who are "different," such as homosexuals. Smith does not advocate denigrating anybody, but the sort of view he advances opens the door for others to advocate the denigration of minorities of various kinds. In any case, since Smith does not so much argue for as simply assert his view about human dignity and human teleology, one can't complain that his argument is misguided. All one can do is insist that an argument is needed. I doubt that there is a good argument for this part of his view.

Not just in this case, but in general, in making the case for his account of person Smith argues from, but not much for, critical realism, philosophical personalism, and an anti-foundationalist phenomenological epistemology. His arguing from but not for these foundations for his own view makes his book intensely ideological. This may be a fine approach for people who are already committed to critical realist personalism, as Smith calls his foundational view. However, it leaves the rest of us thirsty for evidence and arguments that are never given in this book.

[1] See, for instance, Stephan Blatti and Paul Snowdon (eds.), Essays on Animalism: Persons, Animals, and Identity. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011.

[2] For an excellent summary of debates over epistemological and ontological versions of theories of emergence, see Timothy O'Connor and Hong Yu Wong, "Emergent Properties", Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.