What is a Picture? Depiction, Realism, Abstraction

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Michael Newall, What is a Picture? Depiction, Realism, Abstraction, Palgrave Macmillan, 2011, 234pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230276550.

Reviewed by John Kulvicki, Dartmouth College


What is a Picture? offers an account of what makes pictures distinct from other kinds of representation (Chs. 1-5), a new look at issues related to pictorial realism (Chs. 6-7), and a very nice discussion of pictorial abstraction (Ch. 8). Newall is a philosopher who also has a background in studio practice and art theory. He has done curatorial work and written art criticism. In that sense, he has a much richer background in the arts than most philosophers of art. Newall's book also speaks to a wider audience than the typical philosophical monograph, and this is something that philosophers will likely find appealing in some respects and frustrating in others. It's appealing because Newall offers a background and perspective on some issues that most philosophers lack. This is clearest in his discussion of pictorial diversity (Ch. 7) and abstraction (Ch. 8), but also in his discussion of painterly techniques meant to mimic subjective effects (Ch. 4). It's frustrating because at many points one wants more philosophical care and detail than Newall offers.

Newall locates his proposal between two views that don't seem to have much space between them: the recognition view (Schier 1986, Lopes 1996), and Wollheim's experiential view (1980, 1987, 1998). Newall suggests:

A surface X depicts Y if and only if (i) X can occasion non-veridical seeing of Y, and (ii) this non-veridical seeing accords with an appropriate standard of correctness. (43)

Appropriateness amounts to having the proper relation to the right kinds of intentions. Newall explicates condition (ii) later on:

(ii) the picture-maker intends X to occasion non-veridical seeing of Y. (61)

One can quibble about (ii) along a number of dimensions, but focus instead on (i). Notice that if one were to substitute 'elicits a visual recognitional response for Y' for 'can occasion non-veridical seeing of Y' one would wind up with something quite close to the recognition theories endorsed by Flint Schier and Dominic Lopes. Substituting 'a viewer sees Y in X' for 'X can occasion non-veridical seeing of Y' results in one version or another of Wollheim's view.

Newall pulls away from the recognition theory by insisting that recognition is necessary, but not sufficient, for non-veridical seeing (21-23). Proper attention to a picture of O will engage one's visual capacity to recognize Os, as part of an experience of O, but one's visual capacity for recognition can be engaged without there being any experience at all. And there is no seeing absent experience. Blindsight is offered as a case in which one gets recognition without experience, and Newall insists that such cases do not afford access to pictures as pictures. The issue concerning recognition without conscious experience has come up in the past, and Lopes (1996, 174-5; 2003, 648-9) suggests that a sufficiently rich, blindsighted encounter with a picture can yield a full understanding of it. Lopes also expresses a reasonable ambivalence about whether such recognition responses involve sub-conscious or unconscious experiences. Newall acknowledges (45) that if recognition always involves a kind of experience, even if it's unconscious, then his view reduces to a recognition view.

By insisting on an experiential component in his account, Newall sidles up to Wollheim. Wollheim never denies that experiences with pictures involve the recognitional deployment of concepts. He just suggests that a special kind of experience -- seeing-in -- makes pictures a distinctive kind of representation. What makes pictorial experience distinctive is the way in which it involves visual awareness of both a picture's surface and its content.

Newall objects to Wollheim's late view of these matters (from 1987 onward), according to which seeing-in is a unified amalgam of two aspects, one involving awareness of a patterned surface and the other involving some sense of things in depth. For Wollheim, this hybrid experience was supposed to be "phenomenologically incommensurate" (1998, 221) with either of the two experiences from which its aspects were derived. For Newall, this position is phenomenologically off the mark (30-32), because it predicts that experiences of pictures are typically much more complicated than they are. Instead, Newall believes pictures evoke simultaneous but separate experiences of their surfaces and their contents.

His objection to Wollheim's late view is not particularly compelling, in part because it seems to conflate seeing-as with seeing-in, something Wollheim was keen to avoid as of the second edition of Art and its Objects (1980). I won't go into detail about this here, in part because his own positive view is more important than his objections to Wollheim. Newall should have noted, however, that Wollheim's early view (1964) suggests that the canvas and the content are experienced at once, but separately. Wollheim's thinking developed in part because he thought his early view inadequate to the phenomenology of pictorial experience. One is left wondering how Newall feels about Wollheim's early work.

Newall goes on to suggest that we experience the picture and the content as coexisting in the same space, at once, when viewing a picture. This pulls away from early Wollheim (1964), who thought that we experience canvas and content at once, but as occupying distinct spaces, so one is not experienced as being spatially related to the other. Newall's "account requires that we have an experience of seeing X and of Y, simultaneously, such that one appears in front of the other." (33) This happens even though the canvas is experienced as being opaque: "We are, for instance, visually aware of Cezanne's surface as made up of opaque, rather than transparent brushstrokes." (34) And while he brings up transparency perception -- such as seeing through a patch of colored glass -- as a reason for thinking that his proposal is plausible (34), Newall does not show how it's relevant, given that he thinks we perceive the canvas as being opaque. I suggest a rather similar view as the best option for one who wishes to endorse an experiential account of pictures, though I offer a different defense of the view's plausibility and don't ultimately endorse such an account of depiction (Kulvicki 2010).

It's unsurprising that Newall's view, toeing a line between recognition and experience, does not require any specific, observer-independent resemblances between pictures and what they depict (Ch. 4). Pictures might often share some properties with their objects, such as aperture color and outline shape (70-91, and see Hyman 2006), but what makes something a picture is whether it can elicit the proper kinds of experiences and their attendant recognition responses. These points are straightforward consequences of Newall's account, and he might have just left things there. Instead, he peels off in three directions related to the theme of resemblance in depiction. First, he tries to undermine John Hyman's (2006) attempt to find specific resemblances between pictures and their objects. Second, he suggests that the role subjective effects play in depiction undermines any attempt to find a significant role for resemblance to play in an account of pictures. And third, he considers what transparency as a feature of pictures (Newall 2003, Kulvicki 2003, 2006) has to say about resemblance's role in depiction. I'll focus on the second and third issues in what follows.

Newall asks us to consider both the depiction of subjective effects by objective effects and depiction of objective effects by subjective effects. The first phenomenon is exemplified by Seurat, who wanted to give the impression of the subjective effect of simultaneous contrast "by heightening the contrasts of hue and tone around the edges of the objects he depicts." (82) The depicted scene merely looks as though it has such heightened contrasts around objects' edges, but the picture itself does manifest such heightened contrasts in order to give a more vivid impression of the depicted scene. (To see this, search for images of "Seurat seated nude".) Second, Josef Albers (2006, 58, 132) suggested that juxtaposed regions of uniform color give the impression of a fluted Doric column (Newall, 84). The fluting effect comes about because such Mach bands give the impression of heightened contrast at their boundaries. (To see this, search for images of "Mach bands".) This subjective effect of the bands allows the picture to depict the perfectly ordinary fluting of a column. Both cases amount to successful depiction without accompanying resemblances, and they suggest to Newall that resemblance theories are in trouble.

Notice that no resemblance account insists that pictures resemble their objects in all the ways that they represent them as being. Pictures of fish are not scaly, or fishy, but we can depict things as being scaly and fishy. So, it's typically not enough to notice that there is something we can depict -- a fluted column -- even though there is some key respect in which the picture fails to resemble a fluted column. After all, no flat picture is fluted. It's for reasons like this that resemblance theorists usually distinguish a number of kinds of content in pictures, one corresponding closely to the respects of resemblance and the others typically being richer, including everything from the fluting of a column to allegorical themes suggested by a Greek ruin.

Newall is aware of this issue, though he seems a bit impatient with it (85-6). He considers a response to the effect that the column is not depicted as fluted, but rather as being composed of flat planes. He ought also to consider whether the content relevant to resemblance is simply not so determinate. Perhaps it just suggests that there is some kind of surface, fluted or not, which we interpret as fluted in some contexts and flat in others. Such a response parries the claim that the resemblance theory is in trouble. But here Newall simply insists that the picture in question determinately depicts a fluted column. Why? Newall intended that the picture depict fluting, rather than anything else (85-6). Makers' intentions are important to determining the contents of pictures, but this kind of response simply sidesteps the resemblance issue.

It's all the more puzzling that Newall does not discuss such a response to his claims against resemblance theories, because the next chapter (Ch. 5) focuses on pictorial transparency: under certain conditions, pictures of other pictures are just like their objects (Kulvicki 2003, Newall 2003; cf. Walton 1984). Newall uses Magritte's La Condition Humaine to illustrate the phenomenon (96), but one can equally consider a picture of Albers's picture of a fluted column. Albers's picture depicts fluting, even though it is not fluted. Does a picture of that picture also depict fluting? Both are composed of uniform bands of color, so both produce Mach band effects. The natural thing to say is that, in some sense, neither Albers's picture, nor the picture of it, determinately depicts fluting or a lack thereof. Why? Well, one and the same pattern of pigment seems an equally good candidate for depicting fluting or uniform ribbons of color. It's very surprising that Newall does not raise this issue when he talks about pictorial resemblance, especially given his articulation of pictorial transparency. He says:

A picture, X, that depicts a picture, Y, will only depict those physical properties of Y's surface that are among X's content-bearing properties. (97)

Shape and color of parts of the picture surface are content-bearing, while the picture's mass and chemical constitution, for example, are not. (There are subtleties here, but for present purposes it suffices to point at these qualities.) Notice what this condition requires. X only depicts those properties of the image Y that X happens to (1) instantiate and which (2) are among its content-bearing qualities. So, while Newall insists that there is no reason to think that pictures generally share qualities with what they depict (Ch. 4), pictures of pictures must do so under some conditions that he later specifies (107). What's more, in these cases pictures only depict those qualities that they share with their objects. This is implausible on both counts.

First, pictures are just objects, like many others, that have qualities like colors and shapes. Why would we not expect pictures of things other than pictures to exhibit systematic similarities with what they represent? Yes, these similarities might be less specific than one typically finds between pictures and pictures of pictures, but it's hard to resist the pressure to admit that there are such things (see Kulvicki 2006, Ch. 4). Moreover, by Newall's own lights, this understanding of transparency seems to give the wrong answers about pictorial content. The picture of Albers's picture depicts an un-fluted surface characterized by uniform bands of color, since it can only depict the physical, content bearing qualities of Albers's picture, and those happen to be uniform bands of color. But according to Newall's theory (Ch. 3), this picture yields an experience of a surface with a fluted structure, and it is perfectly reasonable for the person depicting that picture to intend this effect, because that is an effect one gets looking at the original Albers picture. So, the picture of Albers's picture should depict fluting, in one sense, but it simply cannot, according to Newall's version of transparency.

Second, notice that Newall's key example for illustrating transparency, La Condition Humaine, in some sense depicts a painted, flat surface as such. Being a painted surface and being flat, however, are not content-bearing properties of a painting (even though they are respects in which Magritte's painting resembles the painting it depicts). So, on the one hand he seems committed to the claim that a painting of a painting cannot depict it as flat and painted, contrary to most reasonable ways of thinking about pictorial content. On the other hand, if he is to avoid that result he seems to be working with a restricted notion of pictorial content when he says that a picture of another picture only depicts features that are among its content-bearing properties. The restricted notion of pictorial content, as just noted, is precisely the tool for parrying his objection to the resemblance view.

Overall, up through chapter 5 the book attempts something of a high-wire act. Newall wants to accommodate insights of both experiential views and recognition views without collapsing into either. He wants to accommodate pictorial transparency without accepting a resemblance thesis about depiction. I am not sure his attempt succeeds, but I do enjoy a high-wire act.

The last three chapters of the book, which amount to almost half of its length, are largely independent of the theory that occupies the first five. While I am unsure whether his account of pictorial realism (Ch. 6) makes much progress over past efforts, the discussion of pictorial diversity in Chapter 7 is timely and interesting. What is the range of pictorial representation? Are there ways of depicting things that are incompatible and/or incommensurable with one another? (136) The discussion is intriguing both for the answers it offers and for the ways in which it frames the questions.

Chapter 8 sketches an account of pictorial abstraction, with a focus on the progression from Cubism to the Color Field painting of Jules Olitski. Newall's account draws from art history, art criticism, psychology, and philosophy. He uses Irving Biderman's work to show how abstraction is an exploitation of and development of depictive techniques, and thus sets a frame within which more work on this topic can be done. Fully fleshing out its claims will depend on some detailed art historical, psychological, and philosophical investigation, and I look forward to seeing how that project develops.


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Hyman, J. 2006. The Objective Eye. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Kulvicki, J. 2003. Image structure. Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 61(4): 323-340.

Kulvicki, J. 2006. On Images. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Kulvicki, J. 2010. Heavenly sight and the nature of seeing-in. Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 67(4): 387-397.

Lopes, D. 1996. Understanding Pictures. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Lopes, D. 2003. Pictures and the representational mind. The Monist 86(4): 632-652.

Newall, M. 2003. A restriction for pictures and some consequences for a theory of depiction. Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 61(4): 381-394.

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