What is Analytic Philosophy?

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Hans-Johann Glock, What is Analytic Philosophy?, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 292pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521694261.

Reviewed by Steven D. Hales, Bloomsburg University


There has been a recent spate of books attempting to explain the origins and intrinsic nature of analytic philosophy. Among these, What is Analytic Philosophy? by Hans-Johann Glock is a standout. As a German trained in Britain who is a professor in Zurich, Glock is particularly suited to offer a cosmopolitan assessment of the philosophical scene and especially the purported difference between the analytic and continental flavors. What's more, his book is jam-packed with argument and nuance, perspicuously organized, historically sensitive, and wrapped in a clear, muscular prose.

While some writers are content to offer an historical treatment of the origins of analytic philosophy, or attempt a necessary-and-sufficient-conditions analysis of "analytic philosophy," Glock commendably approaches the subject from several different angles. Chiefly interested in what analytic philosophy presently amounts to, Glock examines not only its genesis, but the geo-linguistic conception of the analytic/continental split, the relevance of the history of philosophy for analytics, whether analytic philosophy is distinguished by particular doctrines, topics of inquiry, or methodology, etc. He eventually works his way to offering a family resemblance account of "analytic philosophy."

The book initially reads like 1st Chronicles in the Old Testament -- it is the tale of who sired whom. Unlike the chronicler, though, Glock draws out the intellectual and argumentative links in his genealogy. Glock begins his historical account with Plato and Aristotle. The former is the source of conceptual analysis and the use of the intuitions of common sense (Socrates remarks to Theatetus that "being only ordinary people, we shall prefer first to study the notions we have in our own minds and find out what they are and whether, when we compare them, they agree or are altogether inconsistent"). The latter is the founder of the analytic/logical method of starting with a proposition Φ to be proven and then reasoning backwards to first principles, from which Φ can be derived.

From Plato and Aristotle, Glock skips late antiquity and the medievals altogether to arrive at the early modern period. While Spinoza, Leibniz, and Descartes get a nod, Glock identifies Kant as the one who genuinely sets the table for the analytic conception of philosophy. In Kant we find a priori metaphysics, the centrality of epistemology, and the vision of philosophy as autonomous from the special sciences while remaining a cognitive discipline. Kant also employs the term "analytic" in a way related to decompositional analysis. Kant the father begat the German idealists, who begat the twins of naturalism (which rejected idealism, metaphysics, and all a priori reasoning) and neo-Kantianism (which offered instead to clarify the logical, conceptual, and methodological preconditions of empirical knowledge).

If Kant is Kronos, then Frege is Zeus, arising out of the milieu of the 19th century German logic and mathematics of Bolzano, Dedekind, Cantor, Gauss, and Riemann. Frege's Begriffsschrift of 1879 was, of course, the invention of modern logic. Frege's work led directly to Russell, not only the discovery of the famous Russell Paradox, but the logicist program of reducing mathematical concepts to pure logic and set theory that Russell and Whitehead developed in Principia Mathematica. Also at the beginning of the 20th century was Russell and Moore's famous revolt against idealism when they abandoned Bradley, McTaggart, and other Britons still in thrall to the old German idealists.

According to Russell, logical analysis uncovers the true logical form of propositions, and not merely their misleading surface grammar. This approach was seen in Principia and in his theory of descriptions. Furthermore -- and this was an aspect of Russell's logical atomism -- true sentences are supposed to be isomorphic to the facts they express and in this way analysis gives the components of reality. Thus logic breeds ontology.

Following Russell, at least initially, was Wittgenstein, who in the Tractatus shared Russell's atomism while rejecting the latter's view that the logical calculus is an ideal language, viewing it instead as an ideal notation of the common structure of natural languages. The Tractarian position that philosophy illuminates the meaningful propositions of science while also revealing the nonsensicality of metaphysics, was influential on the members of the Vienna Circle and the subsequent development of logical empiricism. It is at this point (p. 37) that Glock identifies the positivists' interest in meaning and criteria of meaningfulness as the linguistic turn in philosophy, inherited from Wittgenstein. This is more controversial than Glock initially acknowledges. Dummett, for example, explicitly identifies the linguistic turn (and to Dummett's mind the founding of analytic philosophy) as having taken place not in the Tractatus, but in Frege's Grundlagen of 1884 -- section 62 to be precise. While Glock does dissect Dummett's view that the philosophy of language is definitive of the analytic approach later in the book (5.2), it is never clear why it is Wittgenstein rather than Frege who should get the credit for the linguistic turn.

If Wittgenstein's Tractatus spawned the "ideal language philosophy" of Frege, Russell, Tarski, the positivists, and Quine, then his Philosophical Investigations led to the ordinary language philosophy in the 1950's, pioneered by Ryle, Austin, and Strawson. The collapse of logical positivism in the wake of the suicide of the verification principle of meaning and Quine's critique of the analytic/synthetic distinction in "Two Dogmas of Empiricism" paved the way to a rebirth of metaphysics. According to Glock, there are three distinct branches to post-positivist metaphysics: (1) Quinean ontological naturalism, (2) Strawsonian descriptive metaphysics, and (3) possible world semantics for modal logic and theories of direct reference.

Out of the ashes of ordinary language philosophy arose the philosophy of language, now viewed as its own discipline on a par with the philosophy of law or the philosophy of science. Unlike the logical investigations of formal languages prominent earlier in the century, now the focus is on theories of meaning for natural languages. Glock argues that philosophy of mind developed out of a reversal of the linguistic turn, with the language of thought hypothesis and arguments that intentionality is prior to linguistic meaning. In a breathless race through the last thirty years, he covers the rise and fall of functionalism, identity theories, the development of metaethics, and finally the recent interest in political philosophy and applied ethics.

Even though Glock's thumbnail sketch of the origins and development of analytic philosophy is largely familiar territory for contemporary analytic philosophers, it is still worthwhile connecting the dots. Sometimes, like the Magic Eye, an unexpected pattern might emerge. And, like ceremonial speech, the recitation of our origins story serves a socially unifying function. There are some idiosyncrasies though. For example, Glock tends to overrate the lasting influence of Wittgenstein who, while continuing to loom large in the British perspective, never became much more than a cottage industry in the United States.

Glock spends a considerable amount of ink showing that "continental philosophy" is a misnomer, that analytic philosophy had tight ties to continental Europe at its founding (Bolzano, Brentano, Meinong, Husserl, Frege), secondary development (Schlick, Wittgenstein, Carnap, Hempel, Reichenbach), and the present day. The geo-linguistic view of the analytic/continental divide is wrong in nearly every possible way. After a certain point, however, it feels like firing round after round from the Glock into a scarecrow, as if he spent fifty pages showing that "Kimberly" doesn't actually mean "beautiful meadow," no matter what the baby naming book said. Remember good old direct reference? "Continental Philosophy" is just a proper name -- figuring out quite what it is the name of (a philosophical school, method, set of problems, group of thinkers, etc.) is much more interesting than harping on why it is a bad moniker.

Of course, Glock does more than criticize the name of continental philosophy. He gives a detailed and systematic account of the development of the fracturing within 20th century philosophy, and his knowledge of 19th and early 20th century German political history well informs his discussion of which philosophers might be in contact with whom. He offers a persuasive case that both the story of the British origins of analytic philosophy and the Anglo-Austrian origins tale told by Neurath and Haller are incomplete and lopsided. Glock maintains that analytic philosophy does not contrast so much with French or German philosophy, as with romanticism, irrationalism, and existentialism. Perhaps this is the nature of historical inquiry, but the entire issue of traditions and influences ultimately seems so varied and convoluted that philosophy resembles a braided rope with the strands frayed at the end. Glock attempts to trace back the frayed to the fray, but a linear journey is impossible. He does provide a worthwhile corrective to those who might be tempted to see analytic/continental as exhaustive. American pragmatism does not fit neatly into either of those categories, nor does traditional historical philosophy, which remains a prominent approach in continental Europe. As ways of doing philosophy, both of these might even be at the same metaphilosophical level as analytic and continental, and properly viewed as orthogonal traditions.

One of the familiar complaints against analytic philosophy from other philosophical traditions is that it is ahistorical, and that analytics have a positive disdain for the great figures of yore. It is a curious charge on the face of it, as numerous quintessential analytic philosophers have serious interests in historical figures. Bertrand Russell, Nicholas Rescher, and John Hawthorne have all written books on Leibniz, Michael Dummett has written books on Frege, Arthur Danto and Bernard Williams did serious work on Nietzsche, and Roderick Chisholm was perhaps the world's leading Brentano scholar. No one could plausibly deny that they were or are analytic philosophers. Glock acknowledges that analytic philosophy intentionally constituted a break with traditionalist historical philosophy in that it focused on advancing, solving, or dissolving philosophical problems instead of, in the words of Umberto Eco, "divine recapitulation." To be sure, in the extreme there have been analytic philosophers disdainful of historical figures, but this has been the exception more than the rule.

Glock contends that the most prominent analytic approach to history is a weak historicism, according to which a study of the past is useful to do systematic philosophy without being indispensible to it. Along the way to this conclusion, he rejects the genealogical method inherited from Nietzsche and defended by Bernard Williams. According to Williams, the study of philosophical history is not merely an aid to contemporary philosophy, but essential to it, since "the genesis of certain concepts or beliefs is crucial to their content and validity" (p. 101). Glock argues that Williams' genealogical project is guilty of committing the genetic fallacy.

Unfortunately, Glock's complaints here are misapplied. True, understanding the semiotic origins of our concepts and distinctions will neither support nor undermine the truth of a theory employing them. However, such genealogy might well emasculate our perceived warrant for a theory. Understanding the history of our ideas is crucial for determining which ones are mere legacy code -- holdovers remaining in circulation for outdated and superseded reasons -- and which retain current utility. It is ironic that the analytic philosopher Glock provides a meticulous account of the history of analytic philosophy and its forebears to answer the metaphilosophical (or possibly the meta- metaphilosophical) question of what analytic philosophy is, yet denies that such an account is essential to his own project.

Another option for the defining characteristic of analytic philosophy is that it consists of specific doctrines to which analytics must subscribe, or at least it is a set of narrow topics that are the focus of inquiry. Dummett defends the idea that it is treating the philosophy of language as the foundation of philosophy that marks out analytic philosophy. Other options are the positivists' rejection of metaphysics, or the endorsement of a priori conceptual analysis and conceptual inquiry, or even the post-Quinean enthusiasm for naturalism. Glock carefully considers all of these alternatives, demonstrating that for each of them (1) there are paradigmatic analytic philosophers who do not subscribe to doctrine X or write on that topic Y, and (2) there are continental or traditional historical philosophers who do. Even the idea that analytic philosophers are united by the delimited range of topics on which they disagree is rejected. Glock rightly notes that there seems to be no substantive area of human inquiry upon which analytic philosophers have not opined.

Glock gives very similar arguments for the conclusion that analytic philosophy also does not possess a uniquely defining method of inquiry or style of prose. He canvasses the idea that analytic philosophy might have something to do with (unsurprisingly) analysis. While this was popular from Russell and Moore up through the death-throes of Gettierology, there was never an univocal notion of conceptual analysis to start with, and enthusiasm for the overall project has waned from its heyday. Another proposal is that analytic philosophy is imbued with the scientific spirit, in contrast to the romantic, literary bent of the continentals. Unfortunately, neither Wittgenstein, Moore, nor mid-century Oxford philosophy were so imbued, whereas pre-analytics like Descartes and Kant were. Other possible marks of the analytics are anti-systematicity, brevity, or the optimistic flag of clarity. Glock rejects all of these as either necessary or sufficient conditions of being an analytic. He also rejects necessary and sufficient analyses of concepts as being definitive of being an analytic. This again is ironic, as he is clearly trying to offer an analysis of "analytic philosophy" that applies to all and only analytic philosophers. I confess that at this point I start to wonder just what Glock's own methodology is, and how it constitutes an analytic treatment of the issue at hand. Fortunately, he does get around to answering this question near the end of the book.

Those outside of analytic philosophy -- continentals and traditionalists -- sometimes suspect analytics of failing to be interested in morality or progressive politics, or even worse, to be (gasp!) conservatives. Glock devotes an entire chapter to considering these suspicions, which is rather more than they deserve. Moore's Principia Ethica was a founding document of analytic philosophy, and it is unlikely that any philosopher in history was more politically active than Russell. The positivists developed an original approach to metaethics, Rawls revived political philosophy in the 1950's, and various forms of applied ethics have been robustly investigated over the last forty years. Glock suggests that analytics have no royal road to truth when it comes to moral philosophy, and offers up Peter Singer as an example. In a section unworthy of the rest of the book, Glock declaims, sub specie aeternitatis and without argument, that Singer's views on euthanasia are extremist ones that showcase a failure of rationality (p. 197). But really, it is hard to see why caring about ethical or political issues is the end all and be all of either analytic philosophy or philosophy in general.

After 200+ pages, Glock finally offers his own conception of analytic philosophy. It "is a tradition held together both by ties of mutual influence and by family resemblances." A great deal of the book to this point has been devoted to showing that classical analytic-style definitions of "analytic philosophy" won't work, and the family resemblance move is by now expected. While not original to Glock (he cites Sluga, Hacker, Stroll, and Hylton as saying similar things), he does develop the notion with his characteristic meticulousness. The members of the nuclear family are picked out by reference to an historical tradition, and the cousins are related by virtue of causal influence.

In the final chapter of the book, Glock tries to draw out a few themes in contemporary analytic philosophy. One that he focuses on is an opposition to postmodernism -- that is, postmodernism of the scientifically ignorant, disingenuous, hoaxed-by-Sokal variety. He distinguishes this from relativism, which he admits can be a respectable thesis in the right hands. The rejection of postmodernism may even count as an analytic project, although a rejection of relativism would not. Not that analytic philosophy as currently practiced is the pure channeling of the Logos. Glock takes it to task for needless scholasticism, factionalism, disdain for non-Anglophone writings, and disengagement from the public. I haven't the space to comment on all these complaints, but the last is worthy of brief mention.

Glock criticizes contemporary analytic philosophy as being isolated and failing to engage with the ordinary public. I think this criticism is wildly off the mark. While it is true that in the Anglophone world there are no rock star philosophers like Sartre was and Habermas apparently is, nevertheless many of us are working hard to speak to the general public. Harry Frankfurt's essay On Bullshit was a #1 New York Times bestseller, and people like Nussbaum, Dennett, Blackburn, and Grayling frequently write for the highbrow magazines. John Perry and Ken Taylor host a philosophical radio show. Even more, Glock seems unaware of the burgeoning field of popular philosophy books, generally written by analytics, on topics of mass interest such as beer, pets, Monty Python, and the like. Published by respected presses like Blackwell and Open Court, these books aim to show the philosophical issues that underlie the most prosaic activities and interests. It is just untrue that analytic philosophers have made no effort to communicate with a wider audience. How successfully we do so is of course another matter, but then, we have to compete in the marketplace with iTunes, YouTube, and video games.

While contemporary analytic philosophy is certainly a fallible human enterprise, sometimes we should stop focusing our high-powered critical weaponry on ourselves long enough to notice that it's not all bad. Glock does acknowledge analytic merits, but like a schoolmaster he insists that we do better this marking period.

To sum up, the book is written in a lively style with a soupçon of humor to liven the dish, something sadly lacking in most contemporary philosophy. One has to like a book that uses "Donner und Blitzen!" as an expletive. Even the occasional potshots that Glock takes are invariably good for a curmugeonly laugh. While I have raised a few criticisms, What is Analytic Philosophy? is even-handed, well-informed and a must-read for anyone interested in this topic.