What is Ancient Philosophy?

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Hadot, Pierre, What is Ancient Philosophy?, translated by Michael Chase, Harvard University Press, 2002, 362pp, $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0674007336.

Reviewed by Donald Zeyl , University of Rhode Island


What is ancient philosophy? Pierre Hadot makes very clear what he thinks it is not: it is not the deposit of philosophical concepts, theories and systems to be found in the surviving texts of Graeco-Roman antiquity, the subject matter of courses of study in the curricula of modern universities. This subject matter indeed does constitute the “philosophical discourse” of the ancient philosophers. But that discourse is itself merely the expression of what Hadot takes to be the essence of ancient philosophy which, in his view, is . way of life. In the author’s own words, “Philosophical discourse … originates in a choice of life and an existential option—not vice-versa … . This existential option, in turn, implies a certain vision of the world, and the task of philosophical discourse will therefore be to reveal and rationally to justify this existential option, as well as this representation of the world” (p. 3). Moreover, philosophy both as a way of life and as its justifying discourse is not the attainment and deployment of wisdom, but “merely a preparatory exercise for wisdom” which “tend[s] toward wisdom without ever achieving it” (p. 4). It is the primary purpose of this book to establish these claims for ancient philosophy as a whole by demonstrating it to be true of each of its major parts.

The book is divided into three parts. The four chapters that constitute its first part (entitled “The Platonic Definition of ’Philosopher’ and its Antecedents”) attempt to make the case for the author’s thesis by way of a survey of pre-Platonic philosophy. From its inception in Homer, the idea of sophia (wisdom) denoted practical skill, a “knowing how,” and thus when the notion of philosophia makes its appearance in the fifth century BCE, it initially denotes an interest in the practice of various such skills. It is the figure of Socrates, as “mythically” represented in Plato’s dialogues, who transforms the notion of sophia and hence that of philosophia. For Socrates the practice of philosophy presupposes and is motivated by one’s awareness that one is not wise, that one is lacking in something one vitally desires to possess or, more accurately, to be. True wisdom is the knowledge of one’s true good. What is that good? Hadot’s answer: it is “the will to do good,” or “the absolute value of moral intent” (pp. 32–36). The definition of love (erôs) in the Symposium situates the philosopher midway between the lack of wisdom and its possession: thus “the philosopher will never attain wisdom, but he can make progress in its direction … . Philosophy is not wisdom, but a way of life and discourse determined by the idea of wisdom” (p. 46, italics in original). Socrates is himself the very incarnation of philosophy thus understood.

In the second part (“Philosophy as a Way of Life”) Hadot surveys not just the philosophical discourse of Plato, Aristotle and the various post-Aristotelian schools and movements, but also—and particularly—the communities in which that discourse originated, the practices or “spiritual exercises” that were taught and practiced in these communities, and the “spiritual” goals these practices were intended to achieve. What follows are some summary comments along with a few critical observations.

Plato and the Academy (chapter 5). According to Hadot, Plato’s goal in founding the Academy was the creation of “an intellectual and spiritual community whose job it would be to train new human beings … (p. 59). The program of training and research in the Academy from the various branches of mathematics to dialectic had primarily an ethical aim, which was to purify the mind and to “learn to live in a philosophical way … to ensure … a good life and thereby the ’salvation’ of the soul” (p. 65). To achieve this aim various “spiritual exercises” mentioned in several Platonic dialogues including, notably, the practice of death in the Phaedo (64a) and the (practice of?) transcendence over all that is mundane described in the Theaetetus (173d–175e) would have been instituted in the Academy. All these exercises have as their aim the transformation of the self. Hadot recognizes that Plato’s explicit goal in founding the Academy was the transformation of the city, not self-transformation, but insists that for Plato these two coincide. He assumes but fails to show, however, that Plato’s lofty descriptions of the philosophical life formed the basis or goal of a regimen of spiritual exercises, regularly practiced by members of the Academy and intended to enable them to achieve a particular state of the soul. And his account of the practice of dialectic within the Academy as a “spiritual exercise which demanded that the interlocutors undergo … self-transformation” (p. 62) is hardly convincing.

Aristotle and His School (chapter 6). Aristotle, according to Hadot’s account, founded the Lyceum on the model of the Academy—at least with the same ethical goal in mind, if not the same intellectual practices. Unlike Plato, however, Aristotle rejects the coincidence between political transformation and the transformation of the self. The art of politics aims at creating the conditions required for self-transformation. That transformation consists in attaining that super-human, god-like goal of theôria so eloquently embraced in Nicomachean Ethics Book X. This life is the life of intellectual pursuits, and Aristotle’s purpose in founding his school was to cultivate a community in which that ideal life was to be lived out to the fullest extent possible. Given that the research programs Aristotle assigned to his students were in large part empirical investigations, how is such research connected with theôria, which is the contemplative understanding of divinity? Hadot makes the connection as follows: research into mundane things reveals, however indirectly, divine causality, and it is that presence of the divine that attracts us to study them. Our minds, then, are drawn to a contemplation of the divine, and in that contemplation we realize our transformation. It is notable, however, that in his study of Aristotle’s Lyceum Hadot makes no mention of spiritual exercises—disciplines or practices engaged in for the sake of achieving self-transformation. Perhaps he thinks that the various research projects conducted in the Lyceum were themselves such exercises. If so, the concept of a “spiritual exercise” is stretched far too thin; if not, then the absence of a regimen of such exercises from the intellectual/spiritual life of the Lyceum constitutes a significant exception to Hadot’s main thesis.

The Hellenistic Schools (chapter 7). Hadot’s general thesis is most easily demonstrated in the cases of the various Hellenistic schools which arose in the late fourth century BCE. The idea that Epicurus and Zeno (respectively the founders of Epicureanism and Stoicism) established their schools to create communities which pursued some shared way of life to attain a shared spiritual goal is not new, and Hadot demonstrates very effectively how the physical and epistemological theories of these schools were intended to support their spiritual goals. This is true not only of the “dogmatists” (Epicureans and Stoics as well as Platonists and Aristotelians, all of whom affirmed positive doctrines) but also of their opponents, the “skeptics,” who recommended the suspension of belief as the proper path to their spiritual goal. In addition, Hadot shows convincingly that these various spiritual goals, differently described in the different schools—for example, for the Epicureans it was a life of stable pleasure achieved by the limitations of one’s appetites while for the Stoics it was a life of self-coherence, lived in conformity to Nature or Reason—all involved the goal of self-transformation. Each school had its own set of spiritual exercises designed to lead its adherents to the achievement of its particular version of that goal.

Schools in the Imperial Period (chapter 8). The development of philosophy in the age of the Roman Empire is characterized by two outstanding phenomena. The first is a change in pedagogy. Philosophy classes began to be devoted to the reading and exegesis of the texts by the school’s founders, and instructors began in increasing measure to write commentaries on those texts to assist comprehension among their students. The second is the eventual decline of Epicureanism and Stoicism and the ascendancy and development of Platonism (synthesized with Aristotelianism in the Neoplatonism of Plotinus) as the dominant philosophy of late antiquity. As Hadot sketches the first of these developments, his focus is on the order in which the texts of the founders were taught to the students, as illustrative of the stages in their spiritual formation. Thus students would first be required to master texts in which the subject matter was primarily ethical (e.g., Plato’s Phaedo), to promote their souls’ initial purification. They would then progress to texts that were physical (e.g., the Timaeus) that pointed to a transcendent cause of the world’s order, to learn to transcend the physical world. Finally, they would proceed to texts that were metaphysical or theological (or “epoptical,” e.g., the Parmenides or Philebus), to ascend to the contemplation of God or the Ultimate (e.g., the Good or the One). This order is also the organizing principle of Plotinus’ Enneads, as edited by Porphyry. “Each commentary was considered a spiritual exercise … because the reading of each philosophical text was supposed to produce a transformation in the person reading or listening to the commentary” (p. 155). In addition, “professors did not merely teach, but played the role of genuine directors of conscience who cared for their students’ spiritual problems” (p. 156). Neoplatonism, the second development, raised the spiritual aspirations of its adherents to new heights. According to his biographer Porphyry, “for Plotinus the goal and the end consisted of union with the supreme deity and the process of growing closer to him” (quoted on p. 160), and Porphyry reports several instances of Plotinus achieving this unity in non-discursive, mystical unitive experiences.

The concluding chapter of the second part of the book (chapter 9: Philosophy and Philosophical Discourse) —by far its longest—considers the evidence of the prior chapters thematically. Hadot reexamines the relation between philosophy as a way of life and philosophical discourse, and the history and character of spiritual exercises in all the diverse traditions. The common aim of these exercises was to achieve both a concentration of the self (its separation from anything foreign to it and its separation from the past and the future through ongoing self-examination) and an expansion of the self (its “dilation” of itself to encompass the infinite totality of all that is). Thus the study of physics is a spiritual exercise with a moral aim. Philosophical dialogue exists for the sake of spiritual guidance. And finally, the figure of the “sage,” the rarely attainable ideal of all philosophy, though prominent in Stoicism, is present in all the ancient schools.

The final part of the book (“Interruption and Continuity: The Middle Ages and Modern Times”) may be summarized more briefly. Hadot credits the rise of Christianity with the decline of philosophy practiced as a way of life. Christianity positioned itself as a “philosophy” (in Hadot’s sense) with its own regimen of spiritual exercises and spiritual goals, and as this religion came to eclipse the various pagan philosophies, it usurped their spiritual function. Eventually Christian interest in pagan philosophy was limited to its discourse, which was pressed into service as the “handmaiden to theology,” even as its spiritual practices were absorbed into, and substantially altered, Christian spirituality. The prevailing modern view of limiting philosophy to philosophical discourse is rooted in this usurpation. Despite several “recurrences” of the ancient concept of philosophy in post-Medieval times (discernible, for example, in Montaigne and even in Descartes as well as in Kant’s concept of “cosmic philosophy”) the ancient ideal is now all but lost. The book concludes with a more expansive discussion of what it means to live a philosophical life and a plea for a return to that ancient ideal (p. 275–281).

Readers familiar with Hadot’s Philosophy as a Way of Life: Spiritual Exercises from Socrates to Foucault (Blackwell, 1995) will recognize in this work a reprise and elaboration of much of the argument of that earlier work. It is difficult to deny that the author has successfully established his main claim. Reservations are indeed due (as noted earlier) about his account of spiritual exercises in Plato’s Academy and Aristotle’s Lyceum. Here the evidence is pressed into the Procrustean bed prescribed by the author’s demonstrandum. Given that the bulk of the surviving texts from antiquity come from the hands of Plato and Aristotle, and given the historical importance of these two philosophers, this amounts to a serious reservation. One might also object to specific interpretive claims made by Hadot. One is startled to read that for Socrates (as depicted by Plato), the “will to do good” is of absolute value, and not the knowledge of the good. Hadot’s association of Socrates with Kant in this respect (p. 36) is historically anachronistic and seriously misleading. The author also assumes that for both Plato and Aristotle the state in which the soul apprehends its highest object is supra-discursive (see pp. 75 and 76, and p. 88). These assumptions are not supported by any evidence and seem to be derived from a widely shared tendency to read the mysticism of Plotinus back into the epistemologies of Plato and Aristotle. Despite these caveats, it must be acknowledged that this very learned book is a tour de force, a welcome and much needed corrective to the prevailing view of ancient philosophy in our day.