What is Enlightenment?

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Samuel Fleischacker, What is Enlightenment?, Routledge, 2013, 235pp., $31.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415497817.

Reviewed by James Schmidt, Boston University


Samuel Fleischacker argues that Immanuel Kant's discussion of the question "What is Enlightenment?" provides "both the notion of enlightenment that has been criticized for its arrogant aspiration to replace all traditional ways of life with liberal individualism and a much more open, flexible ideal that can help us resist our arrogant aspirations" (1). The former, which Fleischacker dubs "maximum enlightenment" (hereafter, MaxE), is antagonistic towards most forms of religious belief, convinced of the beneficence of science, and suspicious of tradition. In contrast, the "minimalist Enlightenment" (hereafter, MinE) is more modest: it is concerned with "how one holds one's views, not what views one holds" and requires only that "one holds one's belief as a result of thinking responsibly for oneself, rather than as dogma . . . seeks reasons for one's beliefs, opens them to correction by others, and recognizes the strengths and weaknesses of one's reasons" (169).

What is Enlightenment? traces the history of these two conceptions of enlightenment and argues for the virtues of the minimalist conception. Chapters 1 and 2 lay out the contesting versions of enlightenment (MinE and MaxE) found in Kant. Chapters 3 and 4 discuss the critique of MaxE in Hamann, Burke, Novalis, Schelling, and Hegel. Chapter 5 explores how Kant's maximalist conception was taken up in the works of the left-Hegelians and Karl Marx. Subsequent chapters examine the critiques of MaxE mounted by Nietzsche and Heidegger (Chapter 6), Horkheimer, Adorno, and Foucault (Chapter 7), and by the diverse group of thinkers (including Emmanuel Eze, Charles Mills, Carol Gilligan, Robin Schott, Linda Nicholson, Lucius Outlaw, Alasdair MacIntyre, and Hans-Georg Gadamer) whom the author dubs "difference critics" (Chapter 8). A brief discussion of the rehabilitation of Kant's MinE undertaken by John Rawls, Jürgen Habermas, and (in his later works) Foucault follows (Chapters 9), and the book ends with two chapters assessing this rehabilitation (Chapter 10) and suggesting how its shortcomings might be remedied (Chapter 11).

The book has much to recommend it. It ranges widely and discusses a variety of thinkers, both familiar and somewhat less familiar. It is attentive to discussions of the concept of enlightenment that Kant provided in texts other than the now-familiar essay from 1784 (e.g., his 1786 contribution to the Pantheism Dispute "What is Orientation in Thinking?") and examines the implications of Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason  (1793), which Fleischacker sees as articulating the "maximalist" tendencies in Kant's concept of  enlightenment.  Though book's treatment of Foucault as both a critic of MaxE and a defender of MinE is, at first, somewhat puzzling, it nevertheless captures something of the complexity of Foucault's relationship with both Kant and the idea of enlightenment.

It also has a few minor, though in most cases understandable, shortcomings. The book would have benefitted from a consideration of "maximalists" of a more recent vintage than the brief account of Marx and his left-Hegelian predecessors in Chapter 5. At least a passing discussion of the way in which Karl Popper framed his critical rationalism along self-consciously Kantian lines might have been welcome, especially given Popper's affection for Kant's 1784 essay. The chapter on "difference critics" merges lines of criticism that do easily blend together. Critics who see Kant -- and, more generally, the Enlightenment -- as insufficiently attentive to the categories of race and gender generally work within different traditions than either Gadamer or MacIntyre, and these differences are only partly bridged by the brief discussion of the concept of "horizon" on pages 126-127. Disentangling these lines of argument would allow for a contrast between neo-Aristotelean critiques of the Enlightenment and the variety of post-modernist criticisms that emerged in the 1970s and 1980s (along with Popper, Derrida and Lyotard are also missing in action). Finally, one might quibble with the treatment of Kant's response to the question "What is enlightenment?" as somehow analogous to the quartet of questions ("What can I know?, What ought I to do?, What may I hope?, and What is man?") that Kant posed in his Lectures on Logic.[1] While Kant may have written the most famous answer to the question "What is enlightenment?" the question itself (as Fleischacker notes at the outset) was posed by the clergyman Johann Friedrich Zöllner in an article in the Berlinische Monatsschrift. To give credit where it is due, the question that this book is exploring is Zöllner's, not Kant's.

Somewhat more problematic is the assumption that the various thinkers who appear in the book were, in fact, wrestling with the implications of the set of ideas that Fleischacker sees as fundamental to "Kantian enlightenment." While Hamann (who puts in a brief appearance on pp. 43-44) provided a detailed, albeit difficult, critique of Kant's 1784 essay, Burke -- who figures much more prominently in the book (see pp. 50-57) -- did not. Burke's German followers August Rehberg and Friedrich von Gentz seem to have been familiar with Kant's answer, but they are mentioned only in passing (see 46-47). The young Hegel was a reader of the Berlinische Monatsschrift, but while it is hard to see how he could not have been familiar with Kant's responses, all that survives in his Nachlass is a transcription of Moses Mendelssohn's response to Zöllner's question.[2]

Marx and the left Hegelians figure in the book as the principal heirs of the "maximalist" version of "Kantian enlightenment." But the evidence for their debts to Kant is also rather slim. Fleischacker describes Feuerbach as "clearly a representative of the maximalist version of Kantian enlightenment," but concedes that Feuerbach's familiarity with Kant does not seem to have gone beyond firstCritique (76-77). The case for Kant's influence on Marx is not much stronger: Fleischacker cites an 1837 letter from Marx to his father mentioning that he has been reading Kant, notes a passing use of the phrase "categorical imperative" in one of Marx's early writings, and observes that Marx frequently used the word "critique" (81). Why assume, then, that Kant's account of enlightenment -- important though it may be today -- had much influence on nineteenth-century "maximalists"? It was not as if they were at a loss for other thinkers on whom they could draw. The left-Hegelian Edgar Bauer's edition of texts by "German enlighteners of the eighteenth century" included works by Karl Friedrich Bahrdt, Johann August Eberhard, Johann Heinrich Schulz, Andreas Riem, and other now-forgotten figures, but nothing by Kant.[3] And Marx, of course, was quite familiar with the works of the French philosophes and Scottish moralists.

The difficulty of taking Kant's account of enlightenment as the standard against which all later discussions are to be measured is perhaps nowhere clearer than in the brief discussion of Nietzsche (94-98). After observing that Nietzsche rarely engaged in a detailed discussion of Kant's work and instead limited himself to "broad caricature" and "Sneering remarks" (95), Fleischacker suggests, "If we stress Nietzsche's talk of the need for courageous thought, which shatters illusions, Nietzsche can be understood as a maximalist heir to Kantian enlightenment, whatever he thought of Kant himself" (97). But, while Nietzsche may well, at various points in his career, have championed positions that resemble those associated with MaxE, does this justify our viewing him as Kant's heir? When Nietzsche discussed the Enlightenment, he tended to focus on French thinkers and, when he sought eighteenth-century predecessors, he opted for Voltaire -- for him, the great defender of an "aristocratic" enlightenment -- rather than Kant, whom he saw as having been "bitten by the moral tarantula Rousseau."[4]

It would be misguided, however, to view What is Enlighenment? as a reception history of Kant's essay. Fleischacker 's chief concern is philosophical, not historical, and Kant has pride of place in this account not because his answer to Zöllner's question has been particularly influential (though, over the last century, it has been), but rather because the tensions found in Kant's account allegedly recur in later thinkers, whether Kant's answer mattered to them (as is clearly the case with Foucault and Habermas) or not (as would appear to be the case with the various nineteenth-century thinkers discussed in the book). As Fleischacker explains at the close of the second of his two chapters on Kant,

Kant is simply torn between a view on which enlightenment provides the minimal constraints on reasonable conversation, and a view on which it leads to a very specific set of results, on which all reasonable conversationalists should converge. Because Kant was torn on this, he bequeathed an ambiguous legacy on the question of enlightenment to his successors. (39)

For this reason, "the distinction between maximalist and minimalist Kantian enlightenments" is used "to organize the history" that unfolds in the chapters that follow (39).

Characterizing Kant as "torn" between MinE and MaxE implies that he was both aware of the conflict between maximalist and minimalist concepts of enlightenment and unable to commit himself to one concept or the other. Fleischacker argues that Kant articulated a "minimalist" conception in his 1784 answer to Zöllner and in "What is Orientation in Thinking?" but went on to embrace a "maximalist" conception in Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason and The Conflict of the Faculties (1798). While Kant's "minimalist" conception "identified enlightenment with an opened-process of reasoning, structured on general principles" that would be "compatible with a wide variety of views," his "maximalist" conception assumed that the process of "thinking for oneself" would rule out certain beliefs, including (1) religions that privilege ritual or conformity to scripture over moral principles (Fleischacker notes the critique of "Priestcraft" in Religion §3) and (2) philosophical positions that lapse into "enthusiasm" by failing to recognize the limits of reason. He argues that the critique of ritual and scripture is reflected in Kant's "notorious hope that Jews, if they turn to pure moral religion and 'throw off the garb of [their] ancient cult,' can bring about 'the euthanasia of Judaism'" (32) and that his definition of "enthusiasm" capacious enough to encompass such thinkers as John Locke, Johann Heinrich Schulz, and Francis Hutcheson. While conceding that Kant was "no pluralist about either scientific or moral conclusions," Fleischacker finds it hard to see how Kant could maintain that it was impossible to "be both enlightened and a devout religious believer, like [his] friends Moses Mendelssohn and Friedrich Jacobi" (34) or that he "really regarded Locke, Schulz, and Hutcheson as unenlightened" (36).

What led Kant to these puzzling conclusions, Fleischacker suggests, was Kant's commitment (as laid out in the Critique of the Power of Judgment (Ak 5:294)) to both the principle of "unprejudiced" thinking (i.e., "to think for oneself") and the principle of "broad-minded" thinking (i.e., thinking from a "universal standpoint"). This dual commitment drove Kant from the MinE of the 1784 essay to the MaxE of his later works:

the cognitive universalization principle seems to demand that I expect others to hold the same beliefs that I do. Of course, I may have made mistakes in my reasoning, but that just means that I should be sure to check it carefully before reaching any conclusions. What I can't do reasonably . . . is to think simultaneously that I have reasoned properly and that you, if you reason properly, could reach a different conclusion. And this would seem to mean that enlightenment should lead us all to one set of beliefs. (37-38)

For Fleischacker, one of the more lamentable implications of Kant's commitment to the universalization principle is that "The minimalist enlightenment would seem to be incoherent; if enlightenment is an employment of reason, it is inherently a maximalist project" (38). Though both Rawls and Habermas would later introduce premises that "block this slide towards maximalism," he sees little evidence that Kant sought to do the same. Nevertheless, he insists that, Kant "needs to do something of the sort if he wants to hold onto the broadly respectful attitudes he often demonstrates towards his intellectual opponents" (38).

Laying aside the question of just how "respectful" Kant actually was towards Schulz and Jacobi, it is unclear why Fleischacker sees a contradiction between Kant's commitment to a conception of enlightenment that harbored "maximalist" tendencies and Kant's capacity to treat individuals who hold unreasonable positions with a certain measure of respect. Kant, of course, was well aware that moral worth did not hinge on intellectual accomplishments. As for Kant's "notorious" comment that Judaism might eventually find its "euthanasia" in a "pure moral religion, freed from all the ancient statutory teachings," it bears noting that Kant also emphasized that these same "ancient teachings" had been retained in another "messianic faith" -- Christianity. The comment on Judaism had been immediately preceded by a characterization of the diversity of religious sects as "desirable" insofar as it was "a good sign -- a sign, namely that people are allowed freedom of belief." But Kant went on to stress that "it is only the government that is to be commended here." That "enlightened Catholics and Protestants" might come to see one another as "brothers in faith" was, for him, but a preliminary step towards an eventual overcoming of the various sectarian differences in a "pure moral religion" (Ak 7:52). It would seem, then, that Judaism was not the only faith that Kant saw as facing the prospect of "euthanasia" in a "pure moral religion."

This, I suppose, is MaxE with a vengeance, but it is hard to see how it was not already present in the critique of the establishment of fixed religious (or, to use Kant's terminology, "sectarian") doctrines that Kant mounted in the allegedly "minimalist" account of enlightenment from 1784. The "maximalist" tendencies of that essay already prefigure the difficulties that Prussian authorities would later have with Kant's religious writings: the "minimalist" Kant was, as Ian Hunter has argued, already engaged in "a radical transformation of the topography of political legitimacy."[5] If Kant strikes us as "torn" between such alternatives, it is perhaps because later commentators on "What is Enlightenment?" -- including John Rawls, Onora O'Neill, and Jürgen Habermas -- have focused on the implications of his account of "public use of reason" and left his discussion of moral religion (and its political implications) to others.

There would seem, then, little reason to assume that Kant equivocated between -- or, indeed, was even aware of -- the alternatives of MinE and MaxE. But while What is Enlightenment? may bemisguided in seeing Kant as "torn," its consideration of the diverging projects associated with the "Kantian enlightenment" reminds us how contested the concept of enlightenment has been and, perhaps, still remains. It would seem that Zöllner's question still stands.

[1] Immanuel Kant, Lectures on Logic, ed. J. Michael Young, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992) 538.

[2] Johannes Hoffmeister, Dokumente zu Hegels Entwicklung (Stuttgart: Frommann, 1936) 140-143.

[3]Martin Geismar [pseudonymn for Edgar Bauer], Bibliothek der Deutscher Aufklärer des Achtzehnten Jahrhunderts, 5 vols. (Leipzig: Otto Wigand, 1846).

[4]See Graeme Garrard, "Nietzsche For and Against the Enlightenment," Review of Politics 70:4 (2008): 595-608.

[5] Ian Hunter, "Kant's Religion and Prussian Religious Policy," Modern Intellectual History 2:1 (2005): 1-27, 23. Hunter draws on the important work of Michael J. Sauter, now available as Visions of the Enlightenment: The Edict on Religion of 1788 and the Politics of the Public Sphere in Eighteenth-Century Prussia (Leiden: Brill, 2009).