What Is Ethically Demanded?, K. E. Løgstrup's Philosophy of Moral Life

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Hans Fink and Robert Stern (eds.), What Is Ethically Demanded?, K. E. Løgstrup's Philosophy of Moral Life, University of Notre Dame Press, 2017, 380pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780268101855.

Reviewed by Michael Kühler, University of Twente


This is an excellent volume that should be not only of interest to those who already work on Løgstrup's ethics. It will also serve well as a detailed introduction to and discussion of crucial themes of Løgstrup's ethics for readers so far unfamiliar with it.

As stated in the editors' concise introduction, Knud Ejler Løgstrup (1905-1981), although a Lutheran theologian, had a keen interest in developing his ethics (also) on a secular basis, thus claiming its universal validity. Strongly influenced by the phenomenology of Hans Lipps, Løgstrup identifies the ethical demand -- which is also the title of his most influential work, published in Danish in 1956 -- as the central and universal ethical phenomenon. According to Løgstrup, the ethical demand is radical, silent, one-sided, and unfulfillable, and it has to be understood as being prior to any ethical theory.

In a nutshell, Løgstrup's position can be described as follows. Given that we find ourselves in social relations and have influence on how the lives of others turn out, we are responsible for this influence and encounter the ethical demand. We should, thus, care about each other. Yet, we should do so without the intention of fulfilling an explicit ethical demand. We should rather act spontaneously, so that the ethical demand qua demand does not (need to) come into play in the first place. This is why Løgstrup considers the ethical demand to be prior to ethical theory and to explicit moral considerations undertaken by the agent, which both are merely second-best solutions in case we do not act spontaneously in accordance with the ethical demand.

However, since understanding Løgstrup's notion of the ethical demand is obviously not a straightforward matter, it is no surprise that nearly all contributions to the volume set out, to some degree or other, to interpret and critically discuss the concept and its characterizations. Taken together, they provide an in-depth and finely nuanced picture of Løgstrup's ethics.

For the most part, the volume consists of original contributions. Only two chapters have been published previously (Alasdair MacIntyre's and Robert Stern's), and incorporating them adds to the value of the volume, as other contributions directly engage in discussion with claims and interpretations they presented. The volume has four parts, focusing on (1) Løgstrup's criticism of Kant, (2) Løgstrup's relation to Kierkegaard, Heidegger, and Levinas, (3) the development of Løgstrup's ethical position, and 4) a critical discussion of central aspects of his ethics: trust, dependency, and the claim that the ethical demand is unfulfillable.

While this division makes perfect sense, it should be noted that there are numerous thematic overlaps, so that, e.g., the critical discussions of specific aspects of Løgstrup's ethics in part IV should be read against the background of his ontological assumptions, a detailed discussion of which is given in Svein Aage Christoffersen's contribution in part III. Another example is Robert Stern's contribution in part IV, in which he argues in favor of a close parallel between Kant's and Løgstrup's ethical positions, despite the latter's decisive criticism of Kant. Given the first part's emphasis on Løgstrup's criticism of Kant, Stern's contribution should, therefore, best be read (also) against this background.

Part I begins with a translation of one of Løgstrup's earlier writings, "The Anthropology of Kant's Ethics," which is accompanied by a very helpful introductory section by the translator Kees van Kooten Niekerk. Taken together, these two items provide an illuminating insight into the development of Løgstrup's thoughts, especially his move from assuming Lutheran based ordinances, i.e. universally given (normative) social contexts into which we are all born, to the weaker and more sociological statement that each of us is indeed born into a specific social context with normatively defined social roles, but that these contexts are subject to historical and cultural change.

The notion of ordinances is also prominent in Løgstrup's criticism of Kant. First of all, Løgstrup states that Kant's ethics is mainly concerned with overcoming inclinations and temptations, as can be seen in the examples Kant gives. In none of the examples is there any doubt about what the morally right action is. Løgstrup, however, emphasizes the role of ethical conflicts, i.e. situations in which it is unclear what the morally right action would be. These situations are precisely characterized by the anthropological fact that we always already find ourselves in a number of relations to others, i.e. in social ordinances, which may give rise to conflicting duties (typically to different persons). In his focus on practical reason, Kant has no room for taking these situations seriously in ethics.

For Løgstrup, this is, in turn, due to Kant's looking at ethics as he does epistemology. "The decisive feature of moral life is obligation; the primary ethical concept is the concept of duty. Now, that which is obligatory is absolutely necessary; but from the epistemological reflections we know that that which is absolutely necessary has its a priori ground in the concepts of pure reason" (25). Hence, for Kant, an anthropology that goes beyond the role of practical reason and takes seriously our being situated in social ordinances cannot play any significant role in ethics. In contrast to such an impoverished view, Løgstrup claims that "the responsible person has to use his reason to obtain clarity about how the other can best be served in the given situation and under the given circumstances" (32). This means that it is always the other person in her concreteness and her specific needs -- which may differ from her actual desires -- that has to take precedence in ethics. This conclusion reflects Løgstrup's emphasis on the concrete relation to another person, which he regards as the central aspect in ethics and which places us under the ethical demand in his later work.

The two following contributions, by Stephen Darwall and Hans Fink, present an intriguing discussion about whether Løgstrup's position might be akin to Darwall's, as laid out in his The Second-Person Standpoint (Harvard University Press 2006). While Darwall seems to be right in arguing that the ethical demand is indeed particular and involves the second-person standpoint, Fink is surely correct in noting that it does so on a more fundamental level than that of providing the normative framework for introducing concrete moral demands or duties. Darwall acknowledges this at least partially when he admits that the ethical demand of fundamental care is something different than his notion of moral respect for the other.

Part II features contributions that place Løgstrup's work in relation to Kierkegaard, Heidegger, and Levinas, and they are especially helpful in spelling out Løgstrup's phenomenological background and his differences from these thinkers. George Pattison tries to show that Løgstrup at least partially misreads Kierkegaard when it comes to the similarities and differences between Kierkegaard's infinite demand and Løgstrup's ethical demand, and fails to see that there might be more to Heidegger's position in Being and Time than mere nihilism. A likewise highly illuminating confrontation of authors can be found in Peter Dews' contribution. Here Levinas's description of our relation to others, as disclosed in our encountering of the other's face, surely pays off when it comes to interpreting and discussing Løgstrup's explanation of our relation and responsibility to others in terms of the ethical demand. The same holds for Arne Grøn's contribution, which discusses the position of the subject in Løgstrup's ethical demand, as well as the normativity involved in it. Grøn points out that it would be a misunderstanding to consider the ethical demand as straightforwardly a matter of what an agent should do. Nor, according to Løgstrup, is full agency, in the sense of rationally considering and deciding what to do, involved, nor does the ethical demand state concrete moral requirements to be met. Rather, the ethical demand makes explicit for us that we are situated in a concrete ethical relation to another person.

The contributions to part III provide in-depth discussions of the development of Løgstrup's ethics. Løgstrup developed his own position in his writings typically in close readings and discussions of other authors, most important among them Kierkegaard, but also in engaging with fiction and taking novels as providing more detailed and accurate insights into human psychology and social relations than the usually too abstract and artificial examples given by philosophers. This is especially highlighted and elaborated in David Bugge's contribution. Meanwhile, Svend Andersen tries to show how Løgstrup's notion of the ethical demand, despite his clear rejection of Kierkegaard, should nevertheless be best interpreted in close relation to Kiergegaard's infinite demand and in going beyond it. Svein Aage Christoffersen provides an illuminating and very important discussion of the relation between ontology and ethics in Løgstrup. Indeed, Løgstrup's ethics cannot be fully understood without taking into account that it is explicitly formulated as an ontological ethics. The ethical demand, thus, has to be understood as an ontological part of the world, which explains why we encounter it in the situation itself, and not as a demand uttered by another person, not even by the concrete other in the given situation. As Kees van Kooten Niekerk shows in his contribution "Løgstrup's Conception of the Sovereign Expressions of Life" -- a conception which features prominently in Løgstrup's later writings -- even if we act in accordance with the ethical demand, this should ultimately be understood not as a form of (rational) agency, but rather as an ontological result of a sovereign expression of life. This conception, thus, takes up the idea of spontaneity when acting in accordance with the ethical demand and transforms it into a notion of how the ontological fundament of the ethical demand expresses itself in the lives of persons who live well ethically.

The essays in part IV engage in a more critical and systematic discussion of central aspects and concepts of Løgstrup's ethics, particularly of trust, dependency, and the characterization of the ethical demand as unfulfillable. In doing so, the contributions also elaborate once more on Løgstrup's criticism of modern ethical theory. Following up on Løgstrup's criticism, Paul Faulkner discusses the example of why one should return a borrowed book as promised. According to Løgstrup, mainstream ethical theory would construct an ethical principle about keeping promises, based on which the duty to return the book to John could be developed and justified and the specific moral reason for the action spelled out. Løgstrup then maintains that this utterly fails to do justice to the more important and fundamental ethical characteristic of the situation, namely the (ethical) fact that John needs the book. The situation should, therefore, not be analyzed in terms of a moral duty, but rather in terms of trust. John should be able to trust the agent, who, in turn, has to be trustworthy to return the book.

However, it seems to me that Løgstrup and Faulkner fail to make a crucial distinction in their analysis. According to Løgstrup and Faulkner, returning the book would only be a matter of trust if the agent were motivated by John's needing the book. Yet, it might very well be the case that John does not currently need the book, and the agent knows athis. If so, there would be no actual need that the agent could take into consideration. Yet, we would surely argue that the agent should still return the book, and the reason for this within the logic of trust would be that she should return it because she promised to do so. Accordingly, John trusts the agent to keep her promise. This means that, sticking with Løgstrup's analysis, John's need actually refers to the agent's keeping her promise. Hence, the agent should, indeed, be motivated by a need of John's, only not his need for the book but his need for promises made to him to be kept.

Alasdair MacIntyre tries to show that Løgstrup's ethical demand is complementary to a Thomistic ethical position, thereby arguing for incorporating Løgstrup into his favored account of ethics. MacIntyre makes a good case for his claim. Yet, his argument comes with a high price for Løgstrup's position, as Patrick Stokes shows in his contribution. For, such an integration would fail to do justice not only to Løgstrup's ontological presuppositions and his emphasis on spontaneity, i.e. the (partial) absence of rational agency when acting in accordance with the ethical demand, but also to the idea of the ethical demand being unfulfillable.

This latter idea is discussed in-depth by Wayne Martin, who provides, as do some of the other contributions, a much-needed clarification of how the ethical demand can be regarded as unfulfillable, given that Løgstrup at the same time claims that we can act in accordance with it. Martin analyzes the different levels of Løgstrup's corresponding understanding of the ethical demand by making them explicit in terms of deontic logic. The upshot is that the ethical demand is unfulfillable because it includes the demand not to be necessary in the first place. As soon as we experience the ethical demand as demand in a situation, it is already too late and it can no longer be fulfilled because the content of the demand states that it should be fulfilled spontaneously, i.e. precisely without being considered by the agent as demanded.

Robert Stern ingeniously argues that, despite Løgstrup's criticism of Kant, Kant could in fact be used to support and clarify Løgstrup's account. Løgstrup stresses that acting spontaneously in accordance with the moral demand is central to ethics and, thus, superior to acting morally based on explicit moral reasoning, i.e. because it is one's duty. In light of this, Stern argues that Kant's ethics involves a similar distinction and evaluation, since Kant considers the human will and its need for a (categorical) moral imperative as inferior to a holy will, which necessarily acts morally right due to its holy nature. Consequently, Løgstrup's criticism of ethical theory appears to be too harsh. Put simply, moral theory and explicit moral reasoning is simply what we humans are stuck with.

However, it seems to me that Stern's argument misses a crucial difference between Kant and Løgstrup. Following Kant's distinction between a human and a holy will, it is clear that, as humans, we are unable to act with a holy will. This is simply due to our anthropological makeup. Hence, if Løgstrup's ethical demand would be analyzed in terms of being realizable only by a holy will, this would indeed explain its characterization as unfulfillable. However, it would fail to do justice to Løgstrup's complementary claim that we are able to act in accordance with the ethical demand, thus rendering it realizable after all, even if not qua demand. Once again, incorporating Løgstrup into another ethical framework comes with a cost for Løgstrup's ethics.

If so, however, this would only show once more that the editors have certainly reached one of their most important goals, namely to present Løgstrup's ethics as a position that warrants an in-depth discussion and should be taken seriously as an independent ethical position. This volume is surely an excellent argument for doing so.