What is Islamic Philosophy?

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Roy Jackson, What is Islamic Philosophy?, Routledge, 2014, 190pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415632034.

Reviewed by Peter Adamson, Ludwig-Maximilians-Universität München


The study of philosophy in the Islamic world has become a vibrant and sophisticated field over recent decades. There has been increasingly penetrating analysis of such familiar and pivotal formative figures as Avicenna and Averroes. Scholars have also pointed towards a vast tradition of unexplored texts from the post-formative period (the 12th century onwards). Thus, despite the existence of several introductory books on the topic,[1] one can certainly justify the writing of more up-to-date introductions that convey the philosophical depth and full historical breadth of Islamic philosophy. The book under review here, unfortunately, contributes very little on either score. It does have one distinctive and welcome feature: unlike other introductory offerings on this topic, it discusses developments in 20th century Islamic thought fairly extensively, and looks at possible responses from an Islamic point of view to a range of moral and political issues like cloning, just war, homosexuality, and the treatment of women.

Roy Jackson is well placed to tackle this material, having written a monograph on the 20th century Indian Muslim thinker Mawdudi.[2] Understandably enough, he wrestles with the question of what it would mean to identify the "Islamic" view on any particular moral or political question. Clearly the Quran and hadith are important sources for dealing with such questions, but as Jackson says, "the problem one faces is whose understanding of the Islamic sources is right, if it is at all possible to be right or wrong on such matters" (141). In the end he seems to me to strike a good balance. He sketches the Islamic religious resources that could support a variety of views, without giving in to an "anything goes" hermeneutic according to which Islam would have no distinctive tenets that distinguish it as a "particular religious tradition" (150). I did note the occasional misstep regarding contemporary thought. For instance, I think he misconstrues a remark from the Egyptian scholar al-Qaradawi on cloning (116).[3] But the real problems with the book concern the historical tradition.

Though his expertise and interest seem to lie more with contemporary figures and issues, Jackson devotes about half of the book to philosophers and themes from earlier periods. Here, he gives the impression that he is mostly summarizing other introductions to the field, and has only a passing familiarity with the relevant primary texts. This, along with what must have been a rather sloppy editorial process, has given rise to numerous basic mistakes. To name just a few of the more egregious: Kitab Sirr al-Khaliqa does not mean Book of Causes (18), but Book of the Secret of Creation. (Jackson was probably thinking of the Latin version of the Arabic Proclus, the Liber de Causis.) The role of mysticism in Islamic philosophy is hotly disputed, but it seems risible to describe al-Farabi as a "Sufi" (42), and even readings of Avicenna's Pointers and Reminders that emphasize its mystical section would presumably stop well short of describing the work as a whole by saying that in it, Avicenna "depicts the stages of enlightenment for the mystic" (50). The Farabian work that helped Avicenna understand the Metaphysics was not a "commentary" (49). The Samanids were not an Ismaili dynasty (48).[4] For Suhrawardi and other authors of his time period and beyond, "Peripatetic" is not "really another word for a Neoplatonist" but refers specifically to Avicennan philosophy (65). It should have been obvious to Jackson that Abu Bakr al-Razi and Suhrawardi did not have the same teacher (65), since as he has told us they lived several centuries apart.

In addition to such outright blunders, there are numerous misleading or unjustifiable statements. There is no evidence that al-Kindi employed translators using his own wealth (34); rather he coordinated their work and served as an intermediary with the patrons who funded the activity. Nor is it obvious that the Mongol invasion occasioned the loss of most of al-Kindi's corpus (34), since al-Kindi was not read much for centuries before the coming of the Mongols. A similarly weak grip on the textual tradition is betrayed when Jackson states that Averroes was dependent on Arabic translations of Aristotle because he knew no Greek (55). Were there any Greek manuscripts of Aristotle for him to read in Andalusia, even if he had known the language? Speaking of the Greeks, the idea of evil as privation is not found in Aristotle (52), but was pioneered by Plotinus. Nor does it seem reasonable to ascribe to Aristotle the thought that "God cannot be moral because to exhibit moral virtues is to express a deficiency" (44). On the side of the Islamic sciences, it is careless to refer to a "hadith by Bukhari" (114), which could suggest to the unwary reader that Bukhari was composing rather than collecting reports about the Prophet. And it is rather facile to say that the Quran "requires a form of dualism" (57). In fact many Muslim theologians accepted an atomist (hence physicalist) account of soul.

It may seem pedantic to complain about these slips on matters of detail; some are arguably just a matter of loose speaking. But they are of a piece with the inadequacy of Jackson's historical account more generally. The book offers no coherent narrative about the development of philosophy in the Islamic world. Many figures from the formative period are mentioned but without giving much sense of the evolution of philosophy in this period. The greatest failing on this score is the lack of attention paid to Avicenna. It may be that Jackson is led astray by his contemporary perspective, since over the past century both European historians of philosophy and Muslim intellectuals have looked to Averroes as the greatest figure of the medieval period (a judgment Jackson echoes at 41), despite his small degree of influence on later Islamic philosophy. But one cannot understand the developments of the 12th century onwards without coming to grips with Avicenna and his legacy.[5] Accordingly, there is a yawning gap in Jackson's historical picture, which deals mostly with figures from the 9th-12th centuries and then with intellectuals of recent times.

Jackson does make reference to a couple of figures who have received more attention in other secondary literature, like Ibn Khaldun (here called simply "Khaldun" in accordance with Jackson's odd and distracting policy of always dropping the "Ibn" from names) and Mulla Sadra. But there is no sense of continuity after the time of Averroes. Instead the book implicitly affirms the discredited canard that philosophy in the Islamic world largely died after the 12th century, perhaps because of al-Ghazali's Incoherence (there is a reference to the "damaging seeds" al-Ghazali planted, at 41). Jackson also misses the more basic point that the Incoherence was an attack on Avicennan, not Aristotelian, philosophy. So he also fails to see that in the Incoherence of the Incoherence, Averroes can happily dismiss al-Ghazali as posing little or no threat to the genuine "philosophers," i.e., Aristotle and his exegetes. On one occasion where Jackson does pay attention to thinkers working between the 13th and 19th centuries, the mistakes creep in again: though he is right to contrast Mulla Sadra's view on existence to the stance of Suhrawardi, he wrongly makes them both realists about essences (70).

The book's shortcomings as a historical narrative are matched by its philosophical deficiencies. Of course one must abbreviate difficult ideas in a general introduction to such a huge body of philosophical literature. But the challenge of writing a good introductory book is to simplify without distorting, and Jackson frequently falls short of this goal. For instance when he comes to Averroes' epistemology (one of the most frequently discussed topics in secondary literature on Islamic philosophy), he only obliquely suggests that Averroes was committed to the unity of the human intellect (63)[6] and instead makes a feeble detour to the epistemologies of Hume and Plato (60). On the issue of Avicenna's famous proof for the existence of God, Jackson suggests that it turns simply on a rejection of infinite causal series (51: "contingency cannot go on forever, i.e. there cannot be a series of causes"). But things are more complex: after all Avicenna is an eternalist, and accepts some such regresses, e.g., the generation of individuals within a species. Another core issue regarding Avicenna is his stance on God's knowledge of particulars, about which Jackson provides only one rather disappointing sentence: "Avicenna stated that God does indeed know everything but 'in a universal way,' which is somewhat ambiguous, but he also tends to be in agreement with Ghazzali that nothing escapes God's knowledge" (54). Smaller examples of misleading oversimplification include Jackson's equating creation with efficient causality (43), and saying that the Asharite emphasis on God's will "resulted in absolving humans of any moral responsibility" (111).

When the book sticks to the contemporary Islamic world it is by and large more sure-footed philosophically speaking, though one might sometimes have wanted a bit more ambition, even allowing for the general readership Jackson has in view. It is setting the bar rather low, for instance, to argue that the 9/11 attacks could not have been justified on an Islamic just war theory (132-4). Still, I think that Jackson might well have been able to write a good introductory book on philosophical figures and themes from the contemporary Islamic world. Such a book would have been very welcome, since, as mentioned above, other available introductions to Islamic philosophy concentrate precisely on the material where Jackson is most at sea.

[1] For instance M. Fakhry, A History of Islamic Philosophy (New York: 1983), S. H. Nasr and O. Leaman (eds), History of Islamic philosophy (London: 1995), P. Adamson and R. C. Taylor (eds), The Cambridge Companion to Arabic Philosophy (Cambridge: 2005), M. Campanini, An Introduction to Islamic Philosophy (Edinburgh: 2008), and several books by O. Leaman, such as his A Brief Introduction to Islamic Philosophy (Cambridge: 1999). For purposes of full disclosure, I should mention that I am not only an editor of one of the books just mentioned, but at work on two introductory volumes of my own entitled A History of Philosophy Without Any Gaps: Philosophy in the Islamic World and A Very Brief Introduction to Philosophy in the Islamic World, both for Oxford University Press.

[2] R. Jackson, Mawlana Mawdudi and Political Islam: Authority and the Islamic State (Abingdon: 2010).

[3] The quotation strongly suggests that, when he says that cloning is not "against God's will" but perhaps not "licit" either, al-Qaradawi is not drawing attention to "legal rather than moral concerns." He simply clarifies that whatever happens is in accordance with God's will, but that human actions can be wrong nonetheless.

[4] Although one Samanid emir was converted to Ismailism in the first half of the tenth century CE by the philosopher al-Nasafi.

[5] As has been shown in an abundance of recent secondary literature, for instance Y.T. Langermann (ed.), Avicenna and His Legacy: a Golden Age of Science and Philosophy (Turnhout: 2009); D. N. Hasse and A. Bertolacci (eds), The Arabic, Hebrew and Latin Reception of Avicenna's Metaphysics (Berlin: 2012).

[6] At least, I assume this is what Jackson means by "abstract universal soul." But then I don't understand why he says Averroes fails to support the doctrine "explicitly," since he infamously does so in the Long Commentary on the De Anima.