What is Knowledge?

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Ortega y Gasset, Jose, What is Knowledge?, trans. Jorge Garcia-Gomez, State University of New York Press, 2002, viii + 256 pp, $23.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-7914-5172-0.

Reviewed by Elizabeth Millan-Zaibert, DePaul University


Within the philosophical community of the United States, very little attention is paid to the philosophical contributions of thinkers from Spanish-speaking countries. Philosophers tend to privilege French and German philosophy, dismissing philosophy from Spain and the countries of Latin America as second-rate copies of trends started elsewhere.

There are a few exceptions to the generally disdainful view of Spanish language philosophy. From the start of his publishing career, the Spanish philosopher, José Ortega y Gasset (1883 -1955) received attention from thinkers on both sides of the Atlantic, and most of his central works were translated within a few years of their appearance in Spanish. Moreover, his works were regularly reviewed in prestigious English language publications such as the Times Literary Supplement and continue to be the object of serious study by scholars in the United States.

Ortega distinguished himself as an arch anti-Cartesian, favoring existentialism and historicism, and he went on to develop a provocative and original philosophy of life and history. According to Ortega, one cannot do philosophy in isolation from the historical situation of which one is a part. This view is captured in his famous claim: “I am myself and my circumstances. If I do not save them, I cannot save myself”. Ortega was committed to cultivating an intellectual space that went beyond the narrow confines of the university lecture hall, thereby helping to save the intellectual circumstances of Spain, circumstances endangered by Franco’s repressive regime. In 1923 Ortega founded the Revista de Occidente and with it a book publishing program that made many translations and critical editions available to the Spanish reading public. Ortega was also a regular contributor to daily periodicals, publishing many essays and lectures in the pages of Spanish newspapers. From 1936-1945, due to the political turmoil in Spain caused by the Civil War and its aftermath, Ortega lived in France, Holland, Argentina, Portugal, and Germany. While Spain and many Spanish thinkers remained relatively isolated from the rest of Europe and the world, Ortega maintained an openness and engagement with both, and this is reflected in his philosophy.

The first English translation of José Ortega y Gasset’s lectures on knowledge (Que es conocimiento?) and his essay, Ideas y creencias, by Jorge García-Gómez, is a welcome addition to the slowly growing field of Iberian and Latin American thought in the United States. The book is a volume in the SUNY series in Latin American and Iberian Thought and Culture, edited by Jorge J.E. Gracia and Rosemary Geisdorfer Feal. The series is important because it is dedicated to publishing contributions to a field within philosophy that certainly deserves more attention that it has hitherto received. The series has recently published a translation of Antonio Rodríguez Huescar’s work, José Ortega y Gasset’s Metaphysical Innovation (1994), also translated by García-Gómez

What is Knowledge? is a four-part series of lectures Ortega delivered during 1929-30 in Madrid consisting of: I) Life as Performance, an eight-day course from 1929-30; II) Concerning Radical Reality, three lectures; III) What is Life?, five lectures; IV) Glimpses of the History of Philosophy, three lectures. In an appendix, the translator has included a translation of Ortega’s Ideas y creencias, a series of university lectures published in Spanish in 1940. García Gómez’s explanation as to why he has attached these lectures to the others is simply that: “[he] found good reason to include [Ideas and beliefs] as an appendix…and [he hopes] the reader will learn to appreciate [his] decision after going through the body of the work and the essay itself” (p. 24). A more explicit justification for including this series of lectures as an appendix is in order. And clearly, a strong case can be made for the ways in which Ortega’s Ideas y creencias serves to reveal the systematic connection and integral metaphysical scope of his oeuvre. But, this connection should not be left to the reader to make: García Gómez should have provided a more explicit justification for the inclusion of these lectures in the appendix.

The title of the book, What is Knowledge?, was not given to the collection by Ortega, but by Paulino Garagorri, the editor of the original Spanish book. The translator, García-Gómez, alerts us to the misleading nature of this title and in the introduction gives a clear account of why the reader should not be expecting a theory of knowledge in terms of traditional epistemological parameters. In his analysis, García-Goméz gives a well-argued account of Ortega’s view of the historical character of knowledge, and ties this discussion to the influence of Descartes, Dilthey, Husserl, and others, highlighting Ortega’s solid grounding in the history of philosophy and his innovative breaks with many of the traditional positions developed within that history. Yet, at times García-Gómez drops names in connection with Ortega’s work without providing adequate contextualization. For example, he begins the introduction with a detailed account of Ortega’s criticisms of Nicolai Hartmann’s view of knowledge, yet does now provide any detail whatsoever concerning Ortega’s relation to the German philosophical tradition or to his training in Marburg with some of the leading Neo-Kantians of the period. Other figures are mentioned as well (Abbagnano (p. 3) and Wolfgang Rainer Mann (p. 24)) without adequate background provided to make their connection to Ortega clear or useful. García-Gómez has published several articles on Ortega’s work and is unquestionably a trustworthy guide and analyst of Ortega’s philosophy. Yet, too often, the introduction assumes a reader already well acquainted with Ortega’s work.

García -Gómez has done an admirable job of translating and annotating both sets of lectures included in the book. The lectures entitled What is Knowledge? were first published as a series of articles in the Spanish newspaper El Sol in 1931. They were re-printed in 1964 in the Argentine journal, Humanitas. Only first in 1984 did they appear in book-form, and, as Paulino Garagorri indicates in the preface to the first Spanish book edition, this version was “based on notes [Ortega] drafted for himself in preparation of courses”, so there are some gaps and rough spots to be found in the lectures. The fact that these lectures first appeared in a newspaper is not unimportant. First, this tells us something of the cultural climate in Spain, then and now—something that philosophy in Spain shares with philosophy in Latin America: a deep connection with the press. This connection to a more popular medium of communication affects the style and form in which philosophy is done, often making the work less technical and more accessible to a broader public. Ortega’s lectures are suggestive and bold, presenting in broad strokes a general view of his philosophy of life. If the devil is in the details, Ortega’s philosophy is free of any diabolical traces.

Ortega was a great stylist, and as these lectures reveal, also a great teacher—engaging and charming. Philosophy is a personal matter for Ortega, and his lectures brim with examples that demonstrate this. Consider the following, which Ortega uses to clarify a point he is making regarding the nature of the self: “Whether I like it or not, I have no choice but to live by means of this poorly endowed soul and this rheumatic body in the midst of the not very pleasant Spanish world of 1930” (p. 99). This sort of personal example is in tune with Ortega’s emphasis on human life in terms of activities and the historical situation surrounding those activities.

The book gives us a clear overview of the main currents of Ortega’s philosophical views, e.g., that fundamental reality is not being but life and the accompanying view that vital reason rather than pure reason is the proper object of philosophical investigation. According to Ortega, human beings cannot be defined in terms of their cognitive activity, because knowing occurs in life and is derived from life. Indeed for Ortega, as these lectures make clear, everything is derived from life. It is an understatement to say that this is a difficult claim to defend. And Ortega does not defend it with all of the detail one might like, but the suggestiveness of the claim is valuable in providing a provisional alternative to some of the traditional views that have dominated Western philosophy. He tells us that: “[T]he acknowledgement of life as the primordial reality is the first act of full and incontrovertible knowledge…” (p. 65). My life, according to Ortega, is “the primordic and absolute reality” and is “endowed with a performative, not an objective being” (p. 73). In short, my life is an absolute event happening to itself. We cannot rest content with Descartes’ cogito ergo sum. We must begin philosophy with the insight that we think because we live. Knowledge and reality presuppose something even more fundamental: life.

In order to analyze the term ‘life’, a central concept of these lectures and of Ortega’s philosophy in general, Ortega uses a method that he explicitly distinguishes from that of phenomenology, stating that: “When it describes an act, phenomenology eliminates or reduces its performative character. [By contrast,] we busy ourselves exclusively with it” (p. 65). Ortega was well aware of the radical nature of his views, and in fact told his students: “By means of what I have said, I do not claim to cast sufficient light on these problem, but only to show you the radical sense inspiring my system [of ideas]” (p. 72). Ortega does indeed showcase the radical sense inspiring his system of ideas, but the reader (and most probably the students who were listening to the lectures) is often left without enough light cast on the arguments that support that system of ideas. We finish the first part of the lectures without a sufficiently clear account of what constitutes the performative character of life.

A patient teacher, Ortega often pauses to re-cap his main points. As he says: “We will find ourselves [in these lectures] constantly in need of reproducing the milestones of the intellectual process that is being born in us” (p. 107). He then summarizes the main points he has been developing. For Ortega questions such as ‘What is philosophy?’ and ‘What is knowledge?’ really amount to questions concerning human activity: “[To the question,] what is metaphysics, or philosophy proper? We replied that it is something a human being does…Then we asked about what knowing is…and said that knowing is what a human being does when he or she begins to pose an essential question, namely, what is this or that thing?” (p. 106). The activities of one’s life constitute one of the “two major and radical components” of life, the other being “the circumstance, surroundings, or world” (p. 109).

Ortega develops his position with a keen awareness that he is breaking with trends of the past, trends that he does not think hold much worth to begin with. And Ortega can be a ruthless critic. He criticizes Nicolai Hartmann’s approach to the philosophical problem of knowledge as an example of “scandalous superficiality” (p. 139). According to Ortega, it is superficial to “formulate the problem of knowledge in the usual fashion, i.e., by reducing it to the question of how the intellectual subject or consciousness is capable of grasping being, as if consciousness and being pre-existed apart from each other, and the only thing involved were—as in sleights of hand—to effect the passage from being to consciousness or vice versa”. For Ortega, “all metaphysical problems are rooted in the study of life, in living reason” (p. 151).

Ortega’s goal in these lectures was to present the problem of knowledge as a fundamental metaphysical problem rooted in human life, in the activity of living a human life. He was aware that this was a radical way of presenting the problem of knowledge, but he believed that his rugged path was the one that would ultimately lead to a solution. The value of these lectures does not lie in the solutions they provide, but in the provocative way in which they engage the reader (who is really more like a listener in the lecture hall) in the activity of philosophizing. The lectures serve to remind us of Ortega’s great legacy as a philosopher, but, perhaps, more importantly, as a teacher.