What is Meaning?

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Scott Soames, What is Meaning? Princeton University Press, 2010, 132pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691146409.

Reviewed by Anthony Everett, University of Bristol


This is an outstanding book, probably the best philosophy book I have read this year. In it, Scott Soames offers a compelling critique of traditional theories of meaning, both those which invoke propositions and those which cash out meaning directly in terms of truth conditions, and offers his own alternative account based upon a conception of propositions as cognitive-event types. For Soames, the central problem with the traditional theories of meaning he criticises is that, in essence, they do not genuinely tell us the meanings of sentences of the languages for which they are offered. In contrast, the original and interesting account which Soames himself offers does just that. As one would expect from Soames, the book is extremely rigorous and the arguments are very carefully developed. But it also reads beautifully. Soames does an excellent job of summarizing a great deal of work in semantics and the philosophy of language. And he lucidly sets out the most important motivations, strengths, and weaknesses of the views discussed. The book will not only be of great importance to professional philosophers and linguists but it will also be an accessible and invaluable asset to students. In the end I am very sympathetic towards the claims Soames makes. I will sketch the contents of the book and conclude by noting some directions for future research.

The first chapter lays the ground for what is to follow. Soames presents a summary of the reasons why a semantic theory needs to invoke propositions. But he identifies two explanatory debts that such a theory incurs. Firstly, we need an account of what it is for an agent to bear a cognitive attitude towards a proposition. And secondly we need an account of how it is that propositions can represent the world and bear truth conditions. Traditional accounts of propositions typically take propositions to be inherently representational and take mental states, sentences, and utterances to be representational in virtue of their standing in certain primitive relations to the relevant propositions. Soames will argue that we must reverse the order of explanation here if we are to make genuine headway towards discharging these explanatory burdens.

In the second chapter Soames turns to theories of meaning that invoke propositions and take these to be the contents of representational states and items. Soames frames his discussion by considering the attempts made by Frege and Russell to provide an account of the unity of the proposition, a problem Soames regards as in fact a pseudo-problem that masks the real problem facing accounts that invoke propositions. Soames provides a clear and critical discussion of Frege's notions of saturation and unsaturation together with the notorious problem generated by the concept horse. Next he disentangles the account of propositions offered in Russell's Principles of Mathematics, where Russell appears to take the constituents of a proposition to be unified by the act of assertion. Soames notes that this will not do as it stands, for a proposition need not be asserted to exist, but he suggests that Russell should have taken the act of predication, rather than assertion, as the source of propositional unity.

More precisely, Soames suggests, we can dissolve the alleged problem of propositional unity by taking predication as a primitive notion and allowing that the structural relations that the components of a proposition bear to each other show what the proposition predicates of what. There is, however, a much more serious problem in the neighbourhood. For we need an account of what these structural relations are and how they show what is predicated of what. And Soames notes that there is nothing in a structured collection of propositional components that determines this. Of course we might choose to interpret, say, the ordered pair〈o, Redness〉as showing that Redness is predicated of o. But it is we who choose to so interpret it. There is nothing in the intrinsic nature of that ordered pair which necessitates this, or any other, interpretation. And so we are left without an explanation of how this or any other structure could intrinsically represent the world. Traditional accounts of propositions must explain how propositions can represent anything independently of our taking them to do so.

The third chapter considers truth conditional accounts of meaning, both of the Davidsonian and the possible worlds variety. This chapter does a beautiful job of summarizing and extending a number of arguments which Soames has presented elsewhere. Soames argues that Davidsonian accounts cannot justify their status as theories of meaning. For attempts to justify this status by maintaining that knowledge of such a theory (perhaps taken together with certain other knowledge) is sufficient for understanding the relevant language fail. And the problem with theories of meaning framed in terms of possible worlds, or other truth supporting circumstances of evaluation, is that they individuate meanings too coarsely. Soames concludes that an adequate theory of meaning cannot dispense with structure-encoding propositions.

In the fourth chapter Soames brings out and illustrates the difficulties besetting traditional theories of meaning by presenting a semantics for a simple formal language that assigns sentences of that language to structured propositions and specifies the possible worlds truth conditions of those propositions. The simple language contains a belief-predicate and the semantics takes this to express a relation between agents and structured propositions. The semantics is natural and intuitive, not dissimilar to those often presented in papers and textbooks. But Soames observes that it provides an inadequate account of propositional attitude ascriptions. For if "P" and "P*" are necessarily and a priori equivalent the semantics will assign the same truth conditions to the sentences "John believes that P" and "John believes that P*." And although it may assign different structured propositions to "P" and "P*," and hence to "John believes that P" and "John believes that P*," the structured propositions assigned to "John believes that P" and "John believes that P*" do not allow us to read off from them the content of the beliefs they ascribe to John.

Soames then turns to consider Russell's multiple-relation account of belief, offers some powerful criticisms of it, but uses these to motivate his own account. For Soames, when we entertain or grasp a proposition we predicate one of its constituents of the others and it is this cognitive act of predication that gives the proposition its unity and representational properties. Having given an account of what it is to entertain a proposition, Soames then sketches how we might give an account of the other cognitive relations agents may bear to propositions in terms of it.

If propositions gain their representational properties from the cognitive relations we bear to them, what exactly are propositions? In chapter five Soames develops a preliminary, deflationary, answer to this question that he will later reject. On this deflationary approach propositions are treated simply as theoretical entities that are used to model the predications agents may make. For the moment, Soames identifies the proposition expressed by a sentence with a certain sort of hierarchical structured entity, whose structure parallels the semantically significant syntactic structure of that sentence. He emphasizes that there will be many different, but equally good, versions of the deflationist account that identify propositions with different sorts of structured entities.

As I noted, for Soames, to entertain a proposition is simply to predicate something of something else. So to entertain the proposition that o is red is simply to predicate redness of o, something we do when (for example) our perceptual experience represents o as red, when we form the perceptual belief that o is red, and when we understand an utterance of "o is red." A deflationary account of propositions will simply stipulate that an agent entertains the proposition that o is red just in case she entertains the appropriate structured entity containing o and redness. Thus a structured proposition will encode information concerning what is predicated of what, and hence has representational content. But it is not inherently representational and only gets its content from its conventional association with the corresponding predication that a cognizer might undertake. Soames develops this idea for a simple possible language, assigning structured propositions to its sentences and possible worlds truth conditions to those propositions. Unlike the theory sketched in the previous chapter, however, the theory Soames presents here does allow us to read off the meaning of a belief ascription from the structured proposition assigned to it.

Despite its virtues, however, Soames notes a problem with this deflationary conception of propositions. The difficulty arises when we consider propositions that ascribe propositional attitudes to agents. Consider the proposition:

(*) that John believes that P.

When I entertain (*) I predicate the believing relation of John and the proposition that P. However, suppose that one theory of meaning, let's call it T1, identifies the proposition that P with a particular structured entity S1. There will be another, equally good, theory T2 which identifies propositions with different sorts of structured entities and which identifies the proposition that P with a different structured entity S2.

But then, when I entertain proposition (*), and predicate the belief relation of John and the proposition that P, which structured entity is the object of my predication? Is it S1 or S2 or something else? Of course T1 will model me as predicating something of S1 while T2 will model me as predicating something of S2.

But the fact that we can model the object of my predication in these ways tells us nothing about what the real object of my actual predication is. At best, on the deflationary account, there seems to be no fact of the matter as to which structured entity is the object of my predication. Soames argues that this motivates abandoning a deflationary account of propositions on which they are seen simply as theoretical devices used to model predications.

In chapter six Soames develops a substantive theory of propositions which he calls the Cognitive-Realist theory. After considering but rejecting a suggestion from James Pryor that propositions might be identified with act-types, Soames argues that we should take propositions to be event-types. He notes that utterances are events, suggests that we can take a sentence S to be an event-type of which utterances of S are the tokens, and notes that we naturally predicate truth and falsity both of utterances and of sentences. If we accept this we can allow that certain sorts of event-types can coherently be said to be true or false. So Soames suggests that we identify a proposition with the cognitive event-type corresponding to the relevant predication. Soames allows that his own suggestion does not completely square with our normal way of talking about propositions. We don't normally take propositions to be the sorts of things that occur in Australia or have very few instances or that usually take less than half an hour. Nevertheless Soames thinks we can live with these odd results and they do not fundamentally undermine his suggestion.

Soames goes on to consider whether the event-types he identifies with propositions exist in possible worlds where no events of the relevant type occur. In so far as event-types are abstract entities, he is sympathetic to the idea that propositions exist in worlds where they have no instances. But even if they do not, he notes, this does not prevent us from evaluating their truth values with respect to worlds where they do not exist. For a proposition to be true with respect to a world in which it does not exist is simply for that world to be the way the proposition represents things as being.

At this point, however, I suspect a second issue will occur to many readers. Are there propositions that are so complex that no possible cognitive agent could ever entertain them? Is there, say, a terribly complex proposition which gives a complete description of every possible world? If so then plausibly no possible agent could have the cognitive resources to entertain that proposition and, on Soames's view, it would correspond to an event-type that necessarily had no instances. I don't have strong intuitions about whether there are such propositions, although no doubt some readers will. I note merely that if you think there could be such things then prime facie you can accommodate them within Soames's account as long as you are willing to accept that event-types can exist without having any instances, and you are willing to accept a sufficiently generous principle of recombination on which event-types of enormous complexity may be generated from combining simpler event types.

In the last chapter of the book Soames considers how the account he offers for PL might be modified to capture some of the complexity of genuine natural languages, such as English. There is a great deal of considerable interest in this material, although I can only very briefly sketch what Soames does here. Soames offers an attractive account of complex singular terms, on which we should take the cognitive act of function application as a primitive along with the act of predication. He offers a plausible treatment of complex predicates and compound sentences, suggesting that in addition to predication (and function application), we should also take the cognitive acts of conjoining or disjoining propositions as primitive. And he concludes by presenting an interesting problem that the traditional Frege-Russell account of quantification presents for his account, and indeed theories of meaning in general. He notes that quantification remains a serious unsolved problem for his account and that an adequate account of quantification may need to depart from the Frege-Russell model.

I want to conclude by returning to the notion of predication. Soames argues that, just as it is legitimate to take the notion of negation as primitive, so we may take the notion of predication as primitive. This seems fair enough. However I think that even if we take the notion of predication as primitive there is more to be said about what predication involves. For example, in his discussion of complex singular terms Soames allows that, even where a function f is undefined for argument a, we may still nevertheless predicate a property of f(a). That is to say we may sometimes predicate properties of things that don't exist. 'Predicate,' Soames suggests, is an intensional verb that behaves analogously to intensional transitive verbs such as "worship" and "look for." But this raises a host of interesting questions. Can we predicate flying of Pegasus? And is this a different sort of event from predicating flying of Fafner? If so, Soames's account should be able to provide a more attractive account of the propositions expressed by sentences containing empty names than standard Russellian accounts. More generally, if propositions are complex event-types, how should we understand their components? What do all event-types whose instances predicate redness of something have in common? And does the act of predication require that we have some sort of prior cognitive fix upon the property predicated and the object of which it is predicated? Exploring these questions is obviously well beyond the scope of Soames's book, but these are important issues for future research.