What is Political Philosophy?

What Is Political Philosophy

Charles Larmore, What is Political Philosophy?, Princeton University Press, 2020, 181pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691179148.

Reviewed by Thom Brooks, Durham University


In this beautifully written and insightful new book, Charles Larmore offers an important vision of what political philosophy is about, and the challenges it faces. The book is composed of an introduction, conclusion, and three chapters in between that have appeared elsewhere, including in the Journal of Moral Philosophy when I was the founding editor, although these essays have been revised and expanded.

Traditionally, many political philosophers whether Kantian, utilitarian or other have looked to reason to better understand the human good or social justice. They have been motivated by the conviction that reason is the instrument with which to overcome disagreements. Of course, there are many dissenting voices that take a different path. Nonetheless, at least since John Rawls identified the problem of maintaining political stability in light of the fact of reasonable disagreement, political philosophers have looked for ways in which reasonable people who reason in good faith can overcome whatever disagreements they might have.[1]

In this book, Larmore takes a step back ‘to seek the larger picture’ of what the core aims and limitations of political philosophy might be (1). He views reasonable disagreement as a formidable problem, but in a different way from Rawls and others. One reason for this is that he rejects the idea that political philosophy must have social justice as its primary concern. This is because the very nature of social justice is itself a subject of fundamental disagreement between reasonable people. We must go deeper, Larmore recommends, to the question of legitimacy as the focus of political philosophy (15). The only way for us to reach consensus, if not agreement, about matters of social justice will be if the exercise of political power is understood to be legitimate. Political philosophy is, at its heart, about the conditions for securing legitimacy. This is in very sharp contrast to many theorists who have viewed social justice and distributive concerns as political philosophy’s main concerns. Larmore is convincing that such a view rests on the assumption that underlying issues about legitimacy are either uncontested or are secondary concerns when they are anything but.

A further consequence of this view is that political philosophy is not some brand of ‘applied moral philosophy’ (5). This is likewise because such a view assumes issues of legitimacy come later, rather than arising from the start. Indeed, Larmore says: ‘disagreement about moral questions is a principal source of social conflict and indeed one that can tear societies apart’ (7). Legitimacy is the primary object of political philosophy, instead. It is because we disagree about the appropriate moral response we need to find some other means—and so not moral philosophy—to find some way to handle this disagreement (24). Moreover, political philosophy is about political power relating to its legitimate exercise with the force of law (46–47). This is a different kind of project than moral philosophy which aims at a comprehensive view of the good.

A second reason why Larmore’s account is novel is that it views this project of securing legitimacy for the exercise of political power against a backdrop of ‘the permanence of conflict’ (175). In this way, Larmore situates himself in political realism, finding disagreement an ineliminable fact of political life for which ‘there can be no complete remedy’ (175). In his view, in moving away from this view of conflict, political philosophers have ‘lost touch with the very nature’ of their subject-matter (71). In short, political philosophy ‘has become insufficiently political’ (72). The ‘ubiquity of conflict’ must return to its centre (72). Legitimacy comes in degrees and ‘no state has ever been fully legitimate’ (118–9). 

Larmore takes a strong line on this point saying that ‘consensus on any of these subjects, when it occurs, is likely due to people failing to have thought deeply enough, to have listened to what others are actually saying, or to have escaped external pressures or internal inhibitions’ (40). This appears to me to be an empirical statement for which we should see some conclusive evidence. I am unsure if any apparent consensus is a mirage hiding deeper disagreement.[2]

While the writing is fluid and I found the book a delight to read, this is not of the garden variety kind of introductory books on ‘what political philosophy is about.’ This is more a philosophy of political philosophy (described as ‘in political philosophy’ and ‘about political philosophy’ in equal measure (3)) that might benefit more advanced undergraduate and graduate students most—and I say this as praise. This really is a book about what political philosophy is about, an insightful work of philosophy rather than a basic survey of familiar terrain. While it requires a basic familiarity with political liberalism, I thoroughly enjoyed the fresh perspective and the novel use of political realism, and moreover it also made me think about political philosophy differently.

Larmore opens his conclusion by stating that ‘this has not been an optimistic book’ (172). He notes that each day brings ‘further evidence of the disintegration of the American political system’ (178). Of course, we are all products of our time and this can reveal itself in various ways in our reflections about the political sphere. However, I disagree that this book lacks optimism. This is because, in clarifying the challenging circumstances within which we do political philosophy, Larmore helps shine a bright light on where we must go with expectations realistically managed. All in all, a terrific achievement that will be of lasting benefit.


John Rawls, Political Liberalism, paperback edition. New York: Columbia University Press, 1996.

Thom Brooks and Martha C. Nussbaum (eds), Rawls’s Political Liberalism. New York: Columbia University Press, 2015.

Thom Brooks, Punishment: A Critical Introduction, 2nd Edition. New York: Routledge, 2021.


[1] See Rawls (1996), and Brooks and Nussbaum (2015).

[2] Larmore highlights disagreement over ‘individual desert’ and ‘the general good’ as some examples (40). Of course, many people disagree about which aim of punishment, for instance, is most preferable in the philosophical literature. But in practice, we see the expansion of sentencing guidelines covering a growing number of jurisdictions. Each claims punishment has multiple purposes, including desert, crime reduction and rehabilitation, among others. There are most definitely issues around how the Model Penal Code or other guidelines can provide a ‘unified’ framework for coherently applying diverse penal purposes in criminal courts. But it is unclear that guidelines using multiple penal purposes cannot be a consensus, even if one was not convinced by it. See Brooks (2021), chapter 7.