What is Race? Four Philosophical Views

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Joshua Glasgow, Sally Haslanger, Chike Jeffers, and Quayshawn Spencer, What is Race? Four Philosophical Views, Oxford University Press, 2019, 283pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780190610180.

Reviewed by Michael O. Hardimon, University of California San Diego


In his provocative 2006 essay, “‘Race’: Normative, Not Metaphysical or Semantic,” Ron Mallon argues that much of the apparent metaphysical debate over race is an illusion.1 There is widespread agreement that racialist race (race conceived of in essentialist and hierarchical terms) is unreal. The remaining metaphysical debate (over whether race understood in a non-racialist way is real) is mostly illusory, since the parties to the dispute operate with different understandings of the word ‘race’ and different theories of meaning. The real substantive philosophical dispute is normative; it concerns what we want our racial concepts, terms, and practices to do.

The welcome appearance of this book suggests that Mallon may have overlooked the possibility that the proper understanding of the terms is one of the points at issue in the metaphysical debate over race and that this metaphysical debate itself contains a normative dimension. The book makes clear that, in addition to being real, the metaphysical debate over race (understood as a complex dispute that includes a semantic and normative dimension) is alive and well. It brings together, in one convenient volume, the metaphysical accounts of race of four prominent philosophers of race at the cutting edge of the field.

The book divides into two parts. In part one, the authors lay out their own views. In part two, they address one another’s positions. Part one begins with Sally Haslanger’s account of race as a sociopolitical phenomenon, followed by Chike Jeffers’ cultural account. Quayshawn Spencer then presents his conception of race as a biological phenomenon. Finally, Joshua Glasgow articulates his understanding of races as visible-trait groups not legitimized by biology but which may count as real in a non-biological, non-social “basic” sense. These four positions represent four of the most important options in the metaphysics of race today. Haslanger and Jeffers offer two forms of social constructionism. Spencer represents biological realism about race. Glasgow offers an ultra-minimalist account. The discussion in the second part of the book is lively and engaging. The degree to which the four authors actually take up one another’s views is remarkable. The book is a model of philosophical discussion. Owing to limitations of space, I will concentrate on the authors’ exposition of their own views.

Haslanger approaches the question concerning what race is as a critical theorist and anti-realist about biological race. Her central purpose is to undermine the hierarchy of White Supremacy. Race for Haslanger just is sociopolitical race. Races are racialized groups, social groups that are represented as races. They are, more specifically, groups whose members are observed or imagined to exhibit bodily features thought to be evidence of ancestral links to a certain geographic region (or regions) and who occupy either subordinate or privileged social positions, depending on the bodily features they are observed or imagined to exhibit. A background ideology represents these individuals as suited to the stratified social positions they occupy, thus motivating and justifying the social hierarchy of race (pp. 25-26). This powerful account identifies one semantically permissible and politically valuable albeit non-standard use of the term ‘race’. A comprehensive specification of what-race-is must include the idea of race as a social construction. Nonetheless, Haslanger’s account needs to be supplemented in two ways.

First, Haslanger seems to think it possible fully to account for sociopolitical race without a biological concept of race. She makes use of the non-biological race-like concept of “color.” Groups whose members are observed or imagined to exhibit bodily features thought to be evidence of ancestral links to a certain geographic region (or regions) are “colors.” But the concept color is not the concept race. The background ideology to which she refers must itself deploy a biological concept of race with which to represent the sociopolitical groups it racializes as races. Racialization does not operate through the application of the benign technical concept color. It operates instead through the application of a pernicious and vacuous biological concept of race that represents social groups as biological races, endowed with “essences” or “natures” that explain why individuals are suited to the subordinate or privileged social positions they occupy. The racialist concept of race has been empirically refuted.2 But critical theory must have this refuted concept at its disposal so that it can refer to the concept’s ideological deployment.

Second, there is reason to think that a viable practice of racialization requires the existence of groups that do in fact exhibit bodily features that are evidence of ancestral links to a certain geographic region. One of the strengths of Haslanger’s account is that it allows for the possibility of particular racialized groups that are merely imagined to have such bodily features. But if no groups exhibited bodily features of the relevant sort, could the project of racialization get off the ground? It would seem that racialization requires the existence of a number of groups that exhibit the right sort of bodily features. If everyone looked like the Dali Lama (to borrow Glasgow’s example), constructing sociopolitical races would be impossible. But groups that exhibit bodily features of the relevant sort satisfy the notion I have elsewhere dubbed the minimalist concept of race.3 Minimalist races are defined as groups that exhibit patterns of visible physical features that correspond to geographical ancestry. What this means is that, in order for there to be sociopolitical races, minimalist races must exist. A full metaphysical account of sociopolitical race must therefore acknowledge the existence this sort of biological race. Social constructionism needs minimalist biological realism about race.

Haslanger’s account has one striking normative deficiency. As Glasgow notes, it cannot countenance the equality of races (p. 139). On her view, sociopolitical races are the only kind of race there are. Social hierarchy is a necessary feature of sociopolitical race; the end of the social hierarchy of race would mean the end of races as such. But isn’t a minimal condition of adequacy on a critical theory of race that it be able to represent racial equality as a coherent social ideal? Critical theory cannot do that unless it possesses a non-hierarchical race concept. The minimalist concept of race is such a concept; nothing in its content precludes racial equality. Indeed, there is reason to think that equality among minimalist races is what the original idea of racial equality comes to. Critical theory needs a concept like the minimalist concept of race to satisfy its own normative aspirations.

Jeffers writes as a social constructionist committed to the preservation of races. His cultural conception of race is political; it represents races as having a political origin. Races “are appearance-based groups that initially resulted from the history of Europe’s imperial encounter” (p. 65). They are characterized (a) by patterns of visible physical features that correspond to geographical ancestry (pp. 39, 40) but do not become races until (b) they are subordinated by other groups (that presumably exhibit different visible physical features) and © develop distinctive cultures in response (50). These cultures are intrinsically valuable; races should, therefore, be preserved.

Jeffers presents his account as a characterization of the metaphysics of race. This commits him to the claim that the features it ascribes to races are necessary — features a group must have in order to be a race. So, on Jeffers’ view, a group must have distinctive cultures to be a race. But is this correct? Why isn’t possession of patterns of visible physical features that correspond to geographical ancestry sufficient for racehood? Surely it is more parsimonious to define races without bringing in the notion of culture. Is it not plausible to say that a group that retained its pattern of visible physical features from t1 to t2 but ceased at t2 to retain the culture it possessed at t1 would remain the same race at t2? Were Blacks to become fully assimilated to “White culture” while retaining their distinctive pattern of visible physical characteristics, they would remain Black. However abhorrent this eventuality may be, its unattractiveness does not constitute a philosophical reason for rejecting the metaphysical point.

Jeffers could abandon his metaphysical claim that groups must exhibit distinctive cultures to be races and defend the notion that the distinctive culture that races possess should be preserved as a purely normative thesis. But this presupposes, dubiously, that each race — including in particular each continental-level race — has a single distinctive culture. As Haslanger points out, “it is not clear how to define a ‘way of life’ that is shared by all Asians, or all Blacks, or all Whites, or all Native Americans” (p. 167). Without the idea that each race has a single distinctive culture, however, the idea that each race should be preserved for the sake of its distinctive culture has no punch.

It is to culture that Jeffers primarily appeals in advancing the ideal of preserving race (p. 58). But, given his specification of what-a-race-is, the preservation of race requires more than the preservation of cultures. It also requires the preservation of patterns of visible physical features.4 But is the long-term preservation of these patterns an attractive goal? I’m not so sure. I do not think we should aim at their elimination. The notion that the only way to eliminate racism is through the literal elimination of race is deeply mistaken. And it is vitally important that members of minimalist races be able to celebrate and affirm their pattern of visible physical features. But Jeffers does not convincingly establish the claim that the long-term preservation of these patterns is something at which we should necessarily aim. It has taken philosophers a very long time to separate the idea of race from the idea of culture. We should be wary of attempts to think them together again.

Spencer approaches the metaphysics of race as a philosopher of science. His basic goal is to show that race, properly understood, is biologically real. More specifically, he wants to show that race, as understood in one specific form of ordinary US “race talk,” namely, “OMB race talk,” has this status. OMB race talk is the racial discourse used by the US Office of Management and Budget. The meaning of ‘race’ in OMB race talk, Spencer contends, is just the set of OMB races: the set of groups to which the race terms used in OMB race talk refer {Blacks, Asians, Whites, American Indians, and Pacific Islanders} (p. 93). The set of OMB races, however, is identical to the set of “human continental populations”, i.e., {Africans, East Asians, Eurasians, Native Americans, and Oceanians} (p. 100). This latter set is a “biologically real entity” (p. 95). It counts as such because it is an epistemically useful and justified entity in a well-ordered research program in biology, namely, population genetics (p. 99), and thus is on a par with other entities that are used in empirically successful biology such as the monophyletic group, the TYRP1 gene, and the hypothalamus (p. 77). Because the set of OMB races is identical to set of human continental populations, it is a biologically real entity. This is the sense in which ‘race’ is real.

The basic idea that the races picked out by OMB race talk are biologically real is well-taken. A full account of “race” must include an account of race as a biological phenomenon. The specific claim that Pacific Islanders are a race can be doubted, since this group includes two subgroups (Melanesians and Polynesians) that exhibit different patterns of visible physical features. But this is a quibble.5 More serious is the worry that Spencer’ account falls prey to a radical form of revisionism.

Spencer makes two main revisionary claims. The first is that is that ‘race’ as used by the OMB does not purport to refer to a kind or category (p. 93). If one thing is clear about the term ‘race’, as it is ordinarily used, it is that it purports to refer to a kind. The concept of race has generality; it reaches beyond particulars. Blacks, Asians, Whites, and so forth are putative instances of the kind. Race is the kind of which Blacks, Asians, Whites and so forth are putative instances. The set {Blacks, Asians, Whites, American Indians, and Pacific Islanders} may — as a matter of empirical fact — exhaustively specify all the races. But then again it may not. Take Hispanics. The OMB contends they are an ethnicity rather than a race. Arguments can be given for and against this claim. But if the meaning of ‘race’ just is the set {Blacks, Asians, Whites, American Indians, and Pacific Islanders}, the answer to this empirical question is settled by the term’s meaning. The fact that it isn’t, is a reason for thinking that this set cannot be the meaning of ‘race’. Another reason for thinking race is a kind is that doing so makes it possible to countenance the possibility that races other than the ones that exist now may have existed in the distant past.

Spencer’s second revisionary claim is that the sense of ‘race’ with which the OMB operates is one on which it is possible that no race is visibly distinguishable from any other (p. 93). This is revisionary because the way ‘race’ is used in American English requires that races be visibly distinguishable. It is essential not to misunderstand the visible distinguishability claim. It does not say that every race is visibly distinguishable from every other race. It allows that Blacks and Melanesians, say, might turn out to be visibly indistinguishable races. (The pattern of visible features they exhibit are very similar. Whether this similarity actually amounts to identity, however, is another matter.) The force of the visible distinguishability claim is that if R1 is a race, there is at least one other race R2 from which R1 is visibly distinguished.

There is no good objection to Spencer’s idea that races are ancestry groups. The problem is with his revisionary contention that they are ancestry-groups-that-may-be visibly-indistinguishable. Spencer is fully aware that his position is counterintuitive (p. 207). But the feature that makes his position counterintuitive is not its biological realism. It is its radically revisionary understanding of ‘race’. Also questionable is the decision to focus so narrowly on the OMB’s use of ‘race’ in the first place.

Glasgow’s account seeks to articulate the ordinary concept of race. The ordinary meaning of ‘race’, on his view, is something like: “Races, by definition, are relatively large groups of people who are distinguished from other groups of people by having certain visible biological traits (such as skin color) to a disproportionate extent” (p. 117). This characterization contains a very important truth but may be importantly incomplete. It leaves out the idea that races are ancestry groups that have distinctive geographical origins. This omission is no mistake. Glasgow elsewhere explicitly rejects the idea that the ordinary concept of race includes these two further conditions.6 Can the ideas of ancestry and geographical origin be jettisoned from the ordinary concept of race?

Maybe not. The matter turns on how the “certain visible biological traits” that races are said to have to a disproportionate extent are to be specified. Some specification is needed lest men and women be counted as races. They are, after all, distinguished by certain familiar visible biological traits to a disproportionate extent. Why don’t they count as races? Glasgow uses the example of skin color to indicate the sort of visible physical traits he wants to capture. But what explains why skin color goes on the list and Adam’s apples do not? Don’t say skin color is racial and Adam’s apples are not. The question is why the one is racial and the other is not. The answer may be that the “relevant kind” of visible physical features are visible physical features that vary with geographical ancestry. What makes a visible physical feature “racial” is the fact that it is part of a pattern of visible physical features that varies in this way. The visible physical traits that Glasgow takes to fix the content of the ordinary concept of race cannot be given a full metaphysical specification without reference to the concepts of ancestry and geography. And, if this is true, these concepts cannot be jettisoned from the ordinary concept of race. Ancestry and geography are built into race ab inito.

Glasgow contends that race, as he understands it, is neither biologically nor socially real. He initially concluded that races don’t exist in any sense and opted for racial anti-realism. But then a student of his, Jonathan Woodward, asked the question, “Granted that race is not a biological or social thing, why does that mean that it couldn’t exist?” (p. 139) Reflection led to the idea they call basic racial realism: “rather than being biologically real, socially real, or illusory . . . race is real in a way that is more ‘basic’ than what science aspires to” (p. 139).

This idea faces two difficulties. One is that it provides no indication of the kind of reality that entities that exhibit basic reality are supposed to enjoy. If you maintain that something is real, it is incumbent on you to specify where it falls on the “ontological map.” To be sure, there are real things that are neither biological or social. Physical things for one. Chemical things for another. But presumably race isn’t a physical or chemical thing. So what kind of “thing” is it? The predicate ‘basicness’ does not fix a kind of thing or domain of reality. But unless we know what kind of thing race is supposed to be or to what domain of reality it is supposed to belong, we are not in a position to assess the claim that it enjoys basic reality. Basicness is presumably not a matter of metaphysical fundamentality. It would be odd to claim that race has that standing. It is just not clear what the predication of basicness to reality comes to. Nor is it clear what sort of reality “basic reality” is supposed to be.

The second difficulty is prompted by an example Glasgow gives to illustrate what it is for something to be basically real. The example is sundog. Sundogs, he contends, enjoy basic reality (p. 139). Sundogs are defined as things that are either suns or dog. Science doesn’t care about sundogs; the category plays no role in its theories. So, sundog doesn’t enjoy scientific reality. But that doesn’t mean that it enjoys no reality. There are things that are either suns or dogs. Fido is a sundog because Fido is a dog. It is therefore plausible, Glasgow claims, to say that sundogs are real. But is this inference plausible? Are we really willing to count sundog as a real entity or kind? One doesn’t have to be an “elitist” to find a metaphysics that allows the generation of a real thing by disjunctively pairing any two existing things problematic.7 Glasgow’s “basic realism” looks like nominalism disguised as realism, the distinction being that nominalism knows that it is not realism. Glasgow’s idea of assigning a minimalist form of reality to race is welcome, but it is by no means clear that the idea of race as a “basic reality” advances the discussion.

These criticisms notwithstanding, the book provides a wonderful snapshot of the current state the metaphysics of race. It will be of interest to philosophers unfamiliar with that debate who would like to know what is going on in the field. It will also be of interest to philosophers familiar with the work of Glasgow, Haslanger, Jeffers, and Spencer who would like to see the latest presentations of their views. This volume could serve as the centerpiece of graduate seminars on race or as a text in upper-level undergraduate philosophy classes. It is a book well worth having.


Thanks to Lucy Allais and Mary Devereaux for helpful comments.

1 Ron Mallon, 2006, ‘Race’: Normative, Not Metaphysical or Semantic," Ethics, 116 n.3, pp. 525-551.

2 Michael O. Hardimon, 2017, Rethinking Race: The Case for Deflationary Realism, Harvard University Press, pp. 12-26

3 Ibid., pp. 27-64.

4 Note, however, that Jeffers says at one point that he believes that “a future in which race is merely cultural is possible” and speaks of the “eventual achievement of a world in which races exist only as cultural groups” (p. 58).

This idea is in tension with the metaphysical status he appears to assign to patterns of visible physical features.

5 I owe this point about Polynesians to Spencer, 2015, “Philosophy of Race Meets Population Genetics,” Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences, 52, p. 50.

6 Joshua Glasgow, 2009, A Theory of Race, Routledge.

7 Joshua Glasgow, 2015, “Basic Racial Realism,” Journal of the American Philosophical Association. 1 n.3, 452.