What Is This Thing Called Happiness?

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Fred Feldman, What Is This Thing Called Happiness?, Oxford UP, 2010, 286 pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199571178.

Reviewed by Michael J. Zimmerman, University of North Carolina at Greensboro



This book deals with the nature and value of happiness. For those familiar with Feldman’s previous writings, it will come as no surprise to hear that What Is This Thing Called Happiness? is a terrific piece of work, a real tour de force. The writing is exceptionally clear, the discussion exceptionally straightforward and sensible, the criticism of other philosophers’ accounts of the nature and value of happiness exceptionally careful and insightful, and the presentation of Feldman’s own account exceptionally interesting. As he has done so often in the past, Feldman has succeeded once again in blowing some badly-needed fresh air on a set of closely-related, philosophically central issues. His book, written in a very lucid style, is accessible to introductory students of philosophy but will be of interest to philosophers at all levels of sophistication, and it will (or at least should - more on this later) engage the interest of those in social sciences such as political science, economics, psychology, and sociology who deal with happiness-related issues. If all such readers were to learn and put to use the lessons that Feldman patiently teaches, not only would the quality of philosophical debates about happiness be greatly improved, but there would also be a sea-change in the way social scientists go about their business.

In this review I will first give an outline of the contents of Feldman’s book and then turn to some minor criticisms.

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Feldman’s book is divided into three parts. Part I presents and criticizes some leading accounts of the nature of happiness. Part II presents and defends Feldman’s own account of both the nature and the value of happiness. Part III discusses the relevance of Feldman’s findings to empirical research.

Feldman begins by explaining the importance of his project. Many people hold that happiness is “The Good,” that is, that a person fares well to the extent that he (or she) is happy. Many hold that we have a moral obligation to promote the happiness of others. Many hold that we have a right to the pursuit of happiness. Finally, many hold that human behavior is at least partly to be explained in terms of the pursuit of happiness. For these and other reasons, it is important to inquire into the nature and value of happiness.

The first account of the nature of happiness that Feldman discusses is Sensory Hedonism about Happiness, a theory advocated in one form or another by Bentham, Mill, and Sidgwick. The core idea is that a person is happy to the extent that he enjoys a surplus of sensory pleasure over pain, unhappy to the extent that he suffers a surplus of pain over pleasure. Feldman rejects this view because it is possible to be unhappy even though one is enjoying a “positive” surplus and to be happy even though one is suffering a “negative” surplus. As an example of the first possibility, Feldman imagines an individual who has purchased a highly touted orgasm enhancer. When he puts the product to use, it is a major disappointment, and he is consequently very unhappy, even though, at the moment of orgasm, he enjoys a positive sensory surplus. As an example of the second possibility, Feldman imagines an individual who has been suffering serious chronic pain and then takes a new drug that dramatically reduces, but does not eliminate, this pain. She is happy even though she continues to suffer a negative sensory surplus.

The second account of the nature of happiness that Feldman considers is the “preferentist” approach advocated by Daniel Kahneman, according to which, roughly, a person is happy to the extent that he wants his present experience to continue, unhappy to the extent that he wants it to cease. Feldman objects to this, noting that some people thrive on change and diversity and would be unhappy to have even their (currently) enjoyable experiences persist, while others may want (out of curiosity, say) an experience to continue even though it is not enjoyable and does not make them happy.

The third account that Feldman examines is another sort of preferentist approach advocated by Wayne Davis. Roughly, according to Davis, a person is happy to the extent that he believes that he is getting what he wants. To this Feldman objects that a person can be cheerful despite the fact that his desires are, and he recognizes them to be, consistently frustrated, and that a person can be glum despite the fact that he consistently gets, and recognizes that he gets, what he wants.

The fourth and final account that Feldman addresses is one that has been proposed by many philosophers, including Richard Brandt, Robert Nozick, and Wayne Sumner. The core idea here is that a person is happy to the extent that he is satisfied with his life as a whole. Feldman notes that there are many variations on this theme (he distinguishes, implicitly, at least 720 such variations), depending on whether it really concerns a person’s entire life or only some portion(s) thereof, whether satisfaction is construed in cognitive or affective terms, whether the satisfaction at issue is actual (one that he in fact experiences) or hypothetical (one that he would experience if he considered the matter in question), and more. Feldman’s objection to the view is this. Either the satisfaction at issue is actual or it is hypothetical. If it is actual, the view must be rejected, since someone can be happy despite never having had any attitude, whether cognitive or affective, toward his life as a whole. If the satisfaction is hypothetical, the view must be rejected, since someone can be happy and yet be such that he would be dissatisfied with his life as a whole were he to consider the matter, and someone can be unhappy and yet be such that he would be satisfied with his life as a whole were he to consider the matter.

Feldman is aware that someone might dismiss his counterexamples to the views just mentioned on the grounds that “happy” is ambiguous, and that the views are intended to account only for a certain sense of the term, one that is distinct from that with which Feldman is concerned. His response is that there is little evidence that the term is ambiguous in common parlance. In ordinary English, it is used in a way that is admittedly somewhat loose and vague, but there is nonetheless a single common sense of the term, and it is this sense that he is concerned to elucidate. Feldman does acknowledge that philosophers have sometimes appealed to a stipulative sense of “happy,” one that is evaluative rather than descriptive. In this sense of the term, the claim that the happy life is the good life is analytic. In the common descriptive sense of the term, however, the sense that Feldman seeks to clarify, this claim is a substantive one that is open to debate.

Having dismissed his rivals’ views on the nature of happiness, Feldman proposes his own view, which he calls Attitudinal Hedonism about Happiness (AHH). This view invokes the concept of attitudinal, as opposed to sensory, pleasure. Sensory pleasure is a feeling or sensation; its “opposite” is pain. Attitudinal pleasure is a propositional attitude directed toward some state of affairs; its opposite is displeasure. For example, Tom may be pleased to be living in Massachusetts; that is, he takes pleasure in (what he takes to be) the fact that he is living in Massachusetts. Such pleasure might be accompanied by a pleasant sensation, but it need not be, and it certainly does not consist in having any such sensation. Roughly, according to AHH, someone is happy to the extent that he is more pleased than displeased about things. More precisely, Feldman proposes the following account (pp. 118-19):

S’s momentary happiness at t = the sum, for all propositions, p, such that S is occurrently intrinsically (dis)pleased about p at t, of the degree to which S is occurrently intrinsically (dis)pleased about p at t.

This account presupposes the following: (1) that intrinsic (dis)pleasure is distinct from extrinsic (dis)pleasure, the former consisting in pleasure taken in something for its own sake, the latter consisting in pleasure taken in something because it is related in some suitable way to something in which one is intrinsically (dis)pleased; (2) that merely extrinsic (dis)pleasure adds nothing to one’s degree of (un)happiness; (3) that occurrent (dis)pleasure, as opposed to dispositional (dis)pleasure, involves one’s thinking about the object of one’s (dis)pleasure; (4) that merely dispositional (dis)pleasure adds nothing to the degree of one’s (un)happiness; (5) that there are “atoms” of happiness (states of affairs consisting in someone’s being pleased or displeased to some determinate degree about some specified propositional object at some specified moment); and (6) that these atoms can be aggregated by summation, pleasure counting positively and displeasure negatively, in order to determine the precise degree to which S is happy at t.

On the basis of this account of momentary happiness, Feldman goes on to give accounts of happiness during an interval, happiness in some domain of life, and happiness over one’s entire life. On one understanding, one’s happiness during an interval is the integral of one’s momentary episodes of happiness that is, it is the total amount of happiness experienced during that interval; on another understanding, it is the average amount of happiness experienced during that interval. The calculation for happiness in a domain of life (such as one’s job, or marriage, or social life, and so on) involves aggregating the momentary episodes of happiness about propositions that have to do with these domains. Finally, happiness over an entire life is happiness during the interval that is one’s entire life.

Feldman recognizes that some may object to AHH. One objection is that one can be (un)happy without being (dis)pleased about anything. This is the problem of “objectless moods.” Feldman’s response is that it is not at all clear that such moods exist. On the contrary, when someone is said to be “just happy” or “just unhappy,” with no particular object being identified as the focus of his (dis)pleasure, what seems to be the case is that he is in fact (dis)pleased about a whole bunch of things in general. Another objection is that Feldman’s account neglects the fact that (dis)pleasure is, or involves, feeling good or bad. His response is that the term “feeling” is ambiguous. If it refers to a sensation, then the objection confuses attitudinal with sensory pleasure. If it refers to an attitude, then his account already accommodates such feelings; just as to “feel confident” or to “feel proud” is simply to be confident or proud, so too to “feel (dis)pleased” is simply to be (dis)pleased. Finally, there is the objection that, since pleasures can be “shallow,” that is, taken in trivial things, Feldman’s account implies that happiness also can be shallow, whereas “true” happiness cannot be. Feldman’s response is that people simply can find “true,” “authentic” happiness in trivial things.

Feldman next turns to the value of happiness, understood in terms of AHH. The particular sort of value with which he is concerned is welfare-value; it is the sort of value that determines whether and to what extent someone is well or badly off. And here Feldman’s thesis is simple: happiness is indeed The Good; that is, welfare tracks happiness. More precisely: how well off a person is at a certain time is directly proportional to his level of (un)happiness at that time; so too for intervals, domains of life, and entire lives. Feldman calls this thesis Attitudinal Hedonistic Eudaimonism (AHE). (AHE is, I think, intended to be equivalent to the view that, in his previous book Pleasure and the Good Life1, Feldman called Intrinsic Attitudinal Hedonism, at least insofar as the latter thesis concerns how well off a person is, as opposed to how well the world is doing.) He recognizes that some may find this view objectionable, too,

One objection to AHE is that it assigns equal value to equal levels of happiness, regardless of whether the happiness in question reflects autonomous values. For example, AHE implies that the proverbial dominated housewife who has been socialized into accepting, and so being happy with, the demeaning conditions of her inauthentic life is leading a life that is just as good as that of the equally happy woman whose life is authentic. Feldman replies that he can find no good reason to “discount” inauthentic happiness in general and thus rejects the suggestion that the housewife’s inauthentic happiness in particular shows the need for any adjustment to AHE. A second objection to AHE is that it assigns equal value to equal levels of happiness, regardless of whether happiness is taken in worthy objects (such as an innocent person’s pleasure) or unworthy objects (such as an innocent person’s pain). Feldman replies that it is not obvious that any adjustment to AHE is needed in this regard either, but notes that, if it is, one can be provided. In this case, AHE will give way to what he calls Desert Adjusted Attitudinal Hedonistic Eudaimonism.

Finally, Feldman discusses the question of how best to measure the happiness of people (an issue that is of practical importance for a number of reasons, including the development and implementation of social policies having to do with health care and the like). He is highly critical of the status quo in empirical research that seeks to engage in or make use of such measurement. He argues that current efforts by social scientists to measure happiness are badly misguided, in great part because they focus on matters having to do, not with happiness as it ought to be construed (i.e., happiness as accounted for by AHH), but rather happiness as it is misconstrued by one or other of the rival theories that he has criticized. Feldman ends by proposing a framework for a better way to measure happiness.

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Many details of Feldman’s treatment of happiness are of course missing from the synopsis that I have given. These details, which include a series of carefully constructed and compelling examples, are important to Feldman’s case for AHH and AHE; through them, he succeeds in making this case a very strong one. His objections to the views of happiness that he criticizes are astute and convincing, and I am convinced, too, that something close to AHH is the proper account of the nature of happiness and something close to AHE is the proper account of the welfare-value of happiness. I have just a few minor criticisms to offer.

First, Feldman claims that how happy a person is and how well off he is are both matters that involve aggregating “atoms” of happiness that involve momentary (dis)pleasures. I am uneasy with this. If “momentary” is to be understood to mean the same as “instantaneous,” I suspect that no (dis)pleasure can be instantaneous. If it means something else, I wonder what that might be. In the end, though, I am not sure whether this difficulty makes any difference to the overall picture that intervals and domains of happiness are to be construed as aggregations of atoms of happiness. However, with respect to such aggregation, I think it is open to question whether it can even in principle be accomplished by way of summation, as Feldman contends. This presupposes that happiness is measurable on a ratio scale, a thesis that is not at all obvious. But perhaps this is a matter of no great importance. I think that Feldman invokes summation primarily for ease of exposition; it seems inessential to the position he espouses.

Second, I am not persuaded by Feldman’s response to the problem of objectless moods and to the related question of how it feels to be (dis)pleased. Feldman recognizes that attitudinal (dis)pleasure is an emotion, and yet he seems sometimes to lose sight of its affective aspect. It is of course true that such (dis)pleasure need not be accompanied by any feeling of a sensory nature; yet emotions – passions— also involve a kind of feeling. Moreover, as I see it, being (dis)pleased is not all there is to feeling (dis)pleased, since one can be very (dis)pleased about something yet dispassionately so. (One indication of this, I believe, is that pleasures can be joyless, or at least not particularly joyful. For example, I can be very pleased that Smith got the promotion he deserved and yet take no great joy in this fact. Feldman appears to vacillate in his own treatment of the relation between pleasure and enjoyment. His official position (p. 114, n. 10) is that they are distinct phenomena, and yet in his discussion he frequently treats them as if they were the same.) Furthermore, I do not agree that apparently objectless moods are in every case to be understood in terms of attitudes whose objects are very general. On the contrary, good cheer, on the one hand, and depression, on the other, strike me as often being genuinely objectless. Still, I grant that this is a tricky issue. If I am right, though, then AHH requires qualification, since some (un)happiness will not consist in (dis)pleasure in anything.

Third, if AHH does require qualification along the lines that I have just mentioned, then, I suspect, AHE should be qualified, too. This is because it seems plausible to say that states of (dis)pleasure that involve feeling good or bad, rather than simply being dispassionately (dis)pleased, are especially (dis)valuable for the person who is (dis)pleased. One might try to accommodate this idea without qualifying AHE by noting that, if someone feels good or bad, one typically takes (dis)pleasure in this fact. I suspect that this observation, even if accurate, does not dispose of the issue, but there is no room to pursue the matter here.

Fourth, Feldman acknowledges that AHE might need adjustment in order to give a proper account of the value of pleasures taken in unworthy objects. I would add two points. First, he mentions only the possibility of “discounting” such pleasures by multiplying the number that represents the amount of pleasure by some number between 0 and 1 that represents how worthy its object is (0 = wholly unworthy, 1 = fully worthy). This neglects the possibility that some objects may be so undeserving of having pleasure taken in them that the number that represents this fact should be negative, thus rendering the pleasure a positively bad thing. Second, Feldman sees no plausibility in making any similar adjustment to the values of displeasures, on the grounds that “displeasure makes you unhappy in equal measure, whether the object deserves displeasure or not” (p. 214). But this seems to misidentify the issue, which is not whether a person is equally unhappy but whether he is equally badly off.

Finally, there is reason to think that an adjustment to AHH may be necessary for a reason that Feldman does not discuss. The matter concerns (dis)pleasures in (dis)pleasures. Suppose that Joe takes pleasure to a certain degree in something but also takes displeasure to the same degree in his taking this pleasure. According to Feldman, Joe will be (insofar forth) neither happy nor unhappy. But I am inclined to think of him as unhappy; the higher-order displeasure would seem to take priority over, and perhaps even to cancel out entirely, the lower-order pleasure.

There is so much good sense in Feldman’s book that one can only hope that others will take his view of the nature and value of happiness to heart and, where appropriate, put it into practice. Unfortunately, there is reason to be pessimistic on this score. Feldman says (p. viii) that he has made attempts to reach across disciplinary boundaries and to interest non-philosophers in his research, yet he has for the most part been rebuffed. I suspect that this is in part because what he has to say constitutes a pretty severe indictment of current empirical research into happiness, and no one likes to be told that he is barking up the wrong tree. But, as far as I can tell, Feldman is absolutely right: a great deal of current research into happiness is fundamentally misguided. Researchers in other fields should swallow their pride, admit their mistakes, and start afresh under Feldman’s guidance. Their doing so would contribute to the happiness and well-being of us all.

1 Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004.