What It Is Like to Perceive: Direct Realism and the Phenomenal Character of Perception

Placeholder book cover

J. Christopher Maloney, What It Is Like to Perceive: Direct Realism and the Phenomenal Character of Perception, Oxford University Press, 2018, 360pp., $41.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190854751.

Reviewed by Lauren Olin, University of Missouri-St. Louis


Veritable orthodoxy among philosophers of cognitive science regards mental states, including conscious perceptual states, as fundamentally representational. J. Christopher Maloney is broadly sympathetic towards this disciplinary consensus -- he is "almost a representationalist" (xvii) -- but the positive arguments put forward in this book are articulated from the fringes of the mainstream.

In his hands, Maloney explains, direct realism can adopt "the generally accepted representationalist thesis that perceptual experience is a kind of contentful cognition" (xix) and at the same time preserve the commonsensical intuition that:

To perceive is to think in a distinctive way about something . . . perception secures its content in a peculiarly direct or immediate manner, in a fashion quite different from the ways in which other forms of cognition only indirectly accrue their content courtesy of a mediating representation. (ibid)

According to Maloney, perceptual representational states facilitate direct access to the world because perceptual representational states extend beyond the boundaries of skulls and skins (cf. Clark and Chalmers 1998). They are supposed to have two components:

  1. a referential component that is identified with, and directed towards some perceived physical object;
  2. an attributive component that is identified with the perceived properties of that object, and also attributes properties to that object.

The phenomenal character of perception is unique, Maloney argues, because the perceiving mind recruits properties of perceptual objects to serve as the vehicles for their own perceptual representations, and these are the properties that determine what it is like to perceive.

The first six chapters critically situate Maloney's view in relation to other naturalistic alternatives to direct realism. First, Maloney targets versions of "intentionalism" according to which all perceptual experiences consist in a subject representing her environment as being a certain way. Second, he goes after "higher-order" theories according to which conscious perceptual experiences involve both the perceptual representation of a scene, and the tokening of a thought that takes the perceptual representation of that scene as its object. The last three chapters are devoted to an articulation and defense of Maloney's own positive view. Chapter seven lays it out in detail, while chapters eight and nine talk about its resources for handling cases of illusion and hallucination that have long troubled direct realist accounts.

This review is organized into three parts. The first section explicates Maloney's perspective on the nature and significance of the phenomenal character of perception. Section two discusses Maloney's treatment of illusion and hallucination in relation to a proposal adapted from the philosophy of science he calls selective eliminativism. The review concludes in section three with some thoughts about Maloney's central background commitments, and about prospects for elaborating his proposed framework empirically and methodologically.

The Phenomenal Character of Perception

Maloney begins his discussion with reference to Nagel's suggestion that questions about what is it like to consciously perceive deserve sustained attention. Maloney outrightly rejects dualistic grounds for meditating on them, and for good reasons: he thinks that the phenomenal character of perceptual experience ought to be explained by perceptual psychology, and that perceptual psychology is a proper part of naturalistic cognitive science. The problem of giving an account of the phenomenal character of perception then quickly reduces, for Maloney, to the problem of explaining how mental states associated with different phenomenal experiences may plausibly represent the same contents. Maloney argues that the phenomenal character of perceptual experience is distinctive because the structure of perceptual representation is distinctive: the representational vehicles for perceptual contents are constituted by properties of objects "out there" in the world that are perceived, while the vehicles for other kinds of mental representations are not.

Maloney motivates his perspective with the help of two main characters, the historical figures Eloise and Abelard. I will follow his lead in using their example to structure my discussion in what follows, for the sake of exposition, and in order to give readers a glimpse of Maloney's prose style.[1] Eloise was a French nun who wrote about the relationship between intention and morality, and is now most widely remembered for her love affair and correspondence with prominent 12th century logician and theologian Peter Abelard. Maloney's Eloise spends a lot of time wondering about the color of Abelard's cloak, which she perceives as CINNABAR, but is sometimes tempted to remember as CERULEAN (2):

Seeing Abelard strutting through the archway cloaked under his flailing cinnabar hood, Eloise thereby visually thinks of that too proud peacock as just so encompassed, situated, and qualified in the evolving scene . . . Later when he is gone and she is elsewhere, might not Elouise consciously recruit from memory what she previously learned about the hooded logician from the fleeting glimpse he gave?

I suspect that Maloney chose Eloise and Abelard because their story lends itself naturally to emphasizing the distinctive phenomenal character of perceptual experience, especially as relative to mnemonic experience. Almost everything reported about their history comes from letters they exchanged, and in many of her letters Eloise worries openly about whether she will ever see Abelard again. Perceptual representations and associated phenomenological experiences, according to Maloney, are special because they are partly constituted by what is represented in ways that memories are not. Maloney references, e.g., Eloise's "post-perceptually phenomenally pale" mnemonic representation of Abelard's cloak (224), and the "pellucid psychological window" that facilitated the formation of that representation (227).

Putative differences in the phenomenology associated with perceptual and mnemonic representations inform discussion throughout the book. Maloney also claims up front, however, that he intends his references to mnemonic states to function as proxies for "any kind of cognitive state some instances of which are plausible candidates for coinciding in content with selected perceptual states" (15). This disclaimer is helpful, but also motivates some skepticism about whether Eloise and Abelard were in fact appropriately cast in the roles Maloney imagines for them: interest in their letters has endured for almost a thousand years in part because the images they conjure are so vivid and compelling, suggesting implicitly that a sharp line between perceptual phenomenology and other sorts of cognitive phenomenology is difficult to draw.[2] Moreover, from another direction: whatever else is right to say about the relationship Eloise and Abelard shared, it was clearly traumatic.[3] It is well documented that highly emotionally valanced memories present more vividly, and sometimes more accurately, than memories lacking strong emotional content. This is perhaps most evident in cases of PTSD involving intrusive, phenomenally rich "re-livings" of traumatic events.

Maloney does seem to be aware of controversies over the distinction between implicit and explicit forms of memory, and associated hypotheses concerning the multiplicity of memory systems. He does not engage more recent work in this tradition suggesting that the line between perceptual and mnemonic states is vanishingly fine. For instance, there is evidence that memory illusions exist, and that they present almost immediately in experience. There is also evidence that false memories can be generated in only about half the time it takes to blink one's eye. The phenomenon is thought to be related to boundary extension, a kind of constructive error in scene representation where observers remember having "seen beyond" the physical boundaries of a view presented to them. Roediger (1996) argues that the phenomenon recommends healthy suspicion towards the perception/memory "divide."

Illusion, Hallucination, and Selective Eliminativism

An old problem for direct realist approaches to perception concerns furnishing some viable account of perceptual illusion and hallucination: these are widely supposed to be cases in which the phenomenology associated with a mental state seems rich and perceptual, but there is no object in the world with the kinds of properties required to explain it. Maloney's positive arguments for accounting for illusion and hallucination in the final chapters remain focused on these traditional challenges to direct realism; he insists the "doctrine of direct acquaintance" must be preserved, and that illusory and hallucinatory experiences must be treated as unified in kind (302).

Recall that, for Maloney, perceptual representations are composed of a referential component that is directed towards some specified external object, as well as an attributive component that is identified with the perceived properties of that object. He argues that in some cases the attributive component of a perceptual representation is determined by a perceiver's internal psychological circumstances and the dispositions she possesses, as well as by features of her broader environment. This move opens up the logical space for cases in which the attributive component of a representation can result from the perceiver's internal cognitions, rather than the properties of her extended environment. Such a perceiver does employ extended representations, and so experiences perceptual phenomenology, but her representations do not all utilize external features of the environment as vehicles. Maloney claims that the phenomenology associated with experiences of illusion and hallucination can be explained by noting that in abnormal environmental circumstances, perceivers may be expected to make "mistakes" because some of their cognitions implicate representations that are not extended.

Traditionally in the philosophy of perception, accounting for cases of mis-perception has been a central goal, but Maloney rejects the importance of this long-standing theoretical demand. Indeed, in the introduction (xxiii-xxiv) he notes that he is in "stark disagreement with both Searle and Disjunctivists" and advises that the "too common inclination to scold some perceptual experiences as nonveridical is in itself mistaken." No doubt this will be an unappealing result to those concerned with securing the epistemic status of perception and associated perceptual beliefs, but Maloney himself seems unperturbed.

The positive proposal Maloney outlines to motivate his perspective is advertised as selective eliminativism. It is pitched as a more modest version of the "radical" eliminative materialist view that questions the ontological status of propositional attitudes wholesale, on the grounds that the folk psychological theories of the mind in which they feature are bad scientific theories. Selective eliminativism, in contrast, recommends that we:

retain what we can, and ought, of commonsense psychology while we also ask of the various kinds of psychological states it posits whether they conform to and cohere with what, upon consideration, we know of ourselves. (304)

While I am sympathetic towards Maloney's rejection of radical versions of eliminativism, his level of engagement with what upon scientific consideration we know about ourselves inspires doubt about his standards for selection. Throughout the book, empirical work seems to be engaged very carefully with an eye towards undermining interpretations that are potentially problematic for Maloney's negative arguments. For instance, in his discussion of work on cognitive penetration, mnemonic preservation, and postdiction in chapter three -- phenomena he describes as involving "troubling peculiar perceptual content" (58) -- Maloney discusses a substantial amount of classical work in cognitive science to secure the possibility that the phenomenal experiences attending instances of perception and instances of recall may be different, even though their contents are the same. Maloney's positive proposal, however, is not articulated with reference to contemporary work in the cognitive neuroscience of vision, or other perceptual modalities.


Maloney's project is original, ambitious, and timely. His book is one of the first to elaborate a view about the metaphysical nature of perception that is explicitly predicated on a version of the extended mind hypothesis. It engages admirably with decades of conceptual arguments concerning the representational structure of perception and the prospects for direct (and naïve) realism. These views have been relatively neglected in mainstream cognitive science, but questions about their status remain among the most significant in the philosophy of perception. His book also, however, treads too lightly on scientific grounds.[4] Maloney's positive view might be developed in empirically sophisticated ways; my concluding thoughts are intended as suggestions for how those developments might go.

Maloney does not engage with contemporary philosophical or scientific work on embodied cognition or the extended mind hypothesis. It is now widely agreed even among proponents of the extended mind that early work lacked the resources needed to distinguish questions about whether cognitive processes are "coupled" with external environmental resources and questions about whether those processes are partly constituted by those resources. Moreover, it is widely agreed that being unable to make such distinctions opens versions of the hypothesis up to charges of cognitive bloat. These issues bear directly on aspects of Maloney's positive view.

Debates about the plausibility of the extended mind hypothesis have also become central in discussions of the prediction error minimization framework (PEM), which has been steadily gaining ground across the cognitive sciences for several decades. According to PEM, the brain instantiates a hierarchically organized probabilistic inference system. By design, the system is thought to predict the input that it receives by constructing models of the possible causes of that input, which are then updated to minimize associated prediction errors. Clark has argued that PEM implies the truth of a version of the extended mind hypothesis: he claims that "what we perceive is not some internal representation or hypothesis but (precisely) the world" (2013: 199). Hohwy (2013), in contrast, has argued that a sharp boundary between the representational mind on one hand, and the represented body and environment on the other, is required to support the explanatory inferences implied by PEM.

Future evaluations and elaborations of Maloney's proposal would benefit from discussions of this work. While failures to engage research in perceptual and cognitive sciences have long been problematic from the perspective of demands on empirical adequacy, they also ought to be regarded as problematic where developments in those sciences are providing new conceptual resources for thinking about classical problems in theories of perception, mental content, and perceptual phenomenology. I suspect that Maloney's answer to the question of what it is like to perceive would be much stronger if it were situated in a more wide-ranging discussion of recent empirical developments; this suspicion may reflect a more fundamental disagreement about "the epistemic standards to which our better angels aspire" (10) when appealing to research on perception in order to elaborate metaphysical theses concerning its nature. Maloney's book is valuable in part because of the ways that he brings such issues into focus.


Many thanks to Carl Craver, Thomas Ames, Eric Wiland, and John Doris for helpful discussion, and special thanks to Eric Hochstein and Michael Tofte for written comments.


Christy, J. (2019). The world is my representation: Direct realism and the extended mind. Metascience, 28, 511-514.

Clark, A., & Chalmers, D. (1998). The extended mind. Analysis, 58(1), 7-19.

Clark, A. (2013). Whatever next? Predictive brains, situated agents, and the future of cognitive science. Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 36(3), 181-204.

Hohwy, J. (2013). The Predictive Mind. New York: Oxford University Press.

Roediger, H. L. (1996). Memory illusions. Journal of Memory and Language, 35(2), 76-100.

[1] Maloney also includes a series of cartoons depicting the possible metaphysical structures of Eloise's perceptual representation of Abelard's cloak.

[2] Some of these concerns are engaged in chapter eight, pp. 273-86.

[3] Though the details of the story of Eloise and Abelard do not bear directly on the status of Maloney's view, I would recommend that anyone who plans to teach this book become familiar with discussions surrounding them.

[4] Another reviewer (Christy 2019) disagrees with this assessment.