What Makes Time Special?

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Craig Callender, What Makes Time Special?, Oxford University Press, 2017, 336pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198797302.

Reviewed by Yuri Balashov, University of Georgia


This is a golden age for the philosophy of time. The industry is booming! One recent trend is especially remarkable: along with important book-length treatments focused on the traditional topics in the analytic metaphysics of time,[1] recent years have witnessed the development of truly interdisciplinary projects intended to bring insights from physics, cognitive psychology, decision theory, neuroscience, biology, linguistics, and other areas to bear on our philosophical understanding of time and temporal experience.[2]

Callender's book is a novel and engaging contribution to this positive development, driven by a desire to understand the emergence of "manifest time" from a physical world initially hostile to it, with the help of disciplines as different as hard-core theoretical physics and experimental psychology (and much in-between).

Our manifest image of time involves three core elements: (i) the notion of an objective present (the "time of our lives" when "all the living -- conscious actions, decisions -- seems to happen" (p. 7)), (ii) the idea of time flow (we are "moving" towards the future, or perhaps the future is "bearing down" on us), and (iii) a drastic asymmetry between the past and the future: we think the former is fixed and the latter open. "Despite its importance," Callender notes, "our best science of time suggests that manifest time is more or less rubbish" (p. 2). This conflict between the time of our lives and the time of physics is very profound. Einstein, among others, was very disturbed by it, and very skeptical about the prospect of resolving it. In response to his skepticism, Carnap noted that physics alone cannot resolve the conflict and should turn for help to psychology. Carnap was not interested in pursuing this project himself. But the need to fill the explanatory gap between physical time and manifest time is pressing. Callender's book is a considered response to Einstein's pessimism and Carnap's challenge.

Physics serves as a natural starting point for this project. Manifest time clashes with physical time in a more profound and less tractable way than Eddington's famous "manifest table" does with the latter's scientific image. "We know -- to a pretty good approximation -- how to get from one of Eddington's tables to another" (p. 25). But when it comes to time, we are really in the dark. No one has a good account of the origin of the many false beliefs we have about time. "By dismissing [them] as illusory, one removes the project of explaining manifest time and places it on the desk of psychologists. The psychologists, however, don't know it's on their desk. The end result is that manifest time remains unexplained" (pp. 23-24). "Explaining manifest time falls between the cracks of physics and psychology" (p. 311). This is right on. We cannot understand the origin of manifest time without "embedding a subject like us in a world like ours" (31). That is exactly what Callender sets out to do in the second half of his book.

But he begins at home. Chapters 2-5 explore various aspects of physical time in the context of relativity and quantum theories.

Classical physics, with its "absolute" Newtonian time "flowing equably," has traditionally been regarded as a natural habitat for manifest time. But Callender reminds us that matters are not simple even here. Despite Newton's own assertions in the Scholium his mechanics has no need, indeed no room, for "time flow" or a distinguished "now" or "past/future asymmetry" -- all for good reason. Less obviously, one is not obligated to formulate classical physics the way Newton did (or the way we learn in high school), starting with a Cartesian coordinate system with three spatial axes and a distinct temporal axis. Recent work on the foundations of spacetime theories, usefully summarized at the beginning of Chapter 2 ("Lost Time: Relativity Theory"), has made it clear that any such theory can be formulated in a four-dimensional framework or in a coordinate-free way, starting with a generic manifold of spacetime points and imposing various geometrical structures on it. One of the dimensions then emerges as having distinct features that allow us to associate it with a "global time function" or with a quotient set of the manifold obtained by imposing a simultaneity relation on it. One can call the resulting geometrical object "time" if one wants, but it takes shape quite late in the process, and its relation to manifest time is far from straightforward. "Nothing in the physics demanded that we carve up the four-dimensional mosaic of events into anything resembling intuitive space or time. Surprisingly, not only does the physics lack any mention of a flowing time, but "space" and "time" aren't explicitly needed either!" (p. 35).

This may be a bit of an exaggeration. Despite being completely silent on the "now," the "flow," and the "asymmetry," the geometrical structure emerging from classical physics has some "pegs" on which one can hang those -- most importantly, a global simultaneity relation. But relativity does away with it, presenting the friends of "tensed time," "absolute becoming," and other A-theoretic notions with the unpleasant dilemma of having to choose between structures that may be congenial to manifest time but are not relativistically invariant (e.g. frame-relative simultaneity relations in Minkowski spacetime) and those that are invariant but too far from the manifest image to be of any help (e.g. proper time measured along timelike trajectories).

Indeed, this dilemma -- the more relativistically invariant the structure becomes, the less room for manifest time it provides, and vice versa -- arises in essentially the same form in many theoretical contexts. One encounters it in the famous "Putnam-Stein debate," with Putnam arguing that the "man in the street's view of time" is definitively refuted by relativity, and Stein offering, as a relativistic substitute, a "local becoming" relation that is so distant from any metaphysically interesting concept of becoming that most philosophers of time deem it completely irrelevant. Callender shows (Chapter 5: "Intimations of Quantum Gravitational Time") that the same dilemma prevents the causal-set program in quantum gravity from delivering on its promise to recover "the time of our life" from cutting-edge theoretical physics. The situation is different in canonical quantum gravity, which is often portrayed as eliminating time altogether. Callender puts this claim under scrutiny; the devil here is in the details, and the reader will benefit from learning more about these two popular programs in quantum gravity from someone who is well-versed in the field.

What about non-relativistic quantum theory? Some philosophers have turned to it for help in reinstating the privileged reference frame and absolute simultaneity. Although it is hardly possible to address this issue in full in a single chapter (Chapter 4: "Quantum Becoming?"), some preliminary conclusions can be drawn, and they are not very comforting to those seeking to recover features of manifest time from quantum mechanics. They should not expect much help from the non-local nature of entangled states, or from the collapse of the wave function, unless the latter is either reified, as is done in some interpretations (GRW), or reconceptualized as a net dynamical effect of quite real non-local influences that are, however, hidden behind the veil of ignorance (as in Bohmian interpretations). This seems to undermine some popular arguments of the "tensers" that appeal to experience. When construed in broadly physical terms, experience would not allow one to get a grip on the preferred frame, even if one existed.

But while physics does not seem to care about the "now" and the "flow" of manifest time, it does not deny that there is something special about the temporal dimension. In fact, physics draws important differences between time and space. Chapters 6-8 develop an interesting new perspective on them. No single feature of physical time deserves to be called "the difference." Instead, there are several logically detachable features that set time apart from space. They include the metrical distinctions associated with the signature of realistic spacetime metrics, the one-dimensionality of time, the "mobility asymmetry" (we can go back and forth in space, but not in time), directionality ("time arrows"), and the existence of timelike but not spacelike "genidentity lines." These features are logically independent of each other. Exploring possible worlds with some of them but not others may be an exciting project. But there seems to be some "glue" that holds them together in our world, and in all sufficiently close physically possible worlds. What is this "glue"?

Callender argues that it has to do with the preferential way in which physical laws are "tuned" to the temporal dimension:

The laws of nature single out time as a distinguished set of directions. Time . . . is the direction in which physics tells its best stories . . . Using this novel picture, I reveal informal connections amongst all our other temporal features. It begins to "glue" together the different fragments of time. In so doing, it justifies the thought that the asymmetry the system seizes upon to write its most powerful algorithms is rightly regarded as temporal. We consequently gain insight into what is special about time (p. 156).

In slogan, time is not only "the great simplifier," but also "the great informer" (p. 140). One way to see this is by "Looking at the World Sideways" (Chapter 8). The argument is rather intricate, for the "best stories" turn out to be none other than "well-posed Cauchy problems" which take quite a bit of machinery to describe. But the general reader will get a very good idea from Chapter 7 ("Laws, Systems, and Time"), which also provides a philosophical underpinning for this novel way of looking at the connection between laws and time, the Mill-Ramsey-Lewis "best-system" theory of laws. If Callender is right, one should expect a lot of purchasing power from the best combination of simplicity and strength or informativeness: it can buy us the entire best package of natural kinds, laws, and geometry, with time emerging as a special dimension of the manifold (p. 151). This is, no doubt, controversial, as is the whole Humean framework of the best-system account of laws. But Callender is right to note that even the anti-Humean will find interesting and illuminating the non-trivial connections he draws among the laws, the topology, the metric, and the "mobility asymmetry" between space and time.

This completes the first half of the task Callender sets for himself, in response to Einstein's challenge and Carnap's promissory note.[3] The other half, remember, is to explain how the false image of manifest time can result from immersing a subject like us (usefully modelled by an IGUS -- an "information gathering and utilizing system") in a physical world like ours. Callender begins by setting his approach against the background of contemporary analytic philosophy of time, specifically, its claim -- shared both by "tensers" (roughly, those who believe that real time has the features of manifest time) and "detensers" (those who deny it) -- that experience favors the "tensed" view. In Chapter 9 ("Do We Experience the Present?"), he argues, persuasively I think, that this claim is false. Being present -- unlike being red, or blue, or rectangular -- makes no difference to the phenomenology or the content of our temporal experience. We are not "appeared to presently."

I plead guilty to thinking otherwise (Balashov 2005). But the recent flood of work on temporal experience has convinced me that my earlier ideas on this matter were confused, due to failure to distinguish two different questions: "Do I have an experience of presentness" versus "Am I simply at present having an experience" (p. 183)? Thanks to Callender, Skow (2015), and others, I now see that the answer to the first question is No, and the second Yes. Unlike Callender, however, I still believe that the innocent-looking positive answer to the second question raises a serious theoretical problem for a certain group of detensers -- those who endorse the view of persistence known as endurantism. In Balashov 2005, I was trying to get at this problem from an ill-conceived phenomenological direction. The real problem is more theoretical in nature.[4]

Let me explain briefly, using Callender's example (p. 183). I think I am typing right now, rather than having breakfast. It should be acknowledged that being present is no part of the content or the phenomenology of my typing experience. Instead, I think I am simply having this experience, rather than the experience of eating breakfast earlier this morning. But if I endure -- roughly, if I persist by being wholly present in the morning and at noon -- then my relation to the morning (i.e. the relation being wholly present at I bear to the morning) and to the breakfast (i.e. the relation having-breakfast-at I bear to the morning) are just as robust as my corresponding relations to the noon and the typing. Moreover, these relations (or some conceptual analogs) should figure in any metaphysical account of the facts I normally express by saying that I am typing and that I had breakfast. I have these experiences one at a time, when I view the world from the perspective of the corresponding time. But I also think that I am viewing the world from the noon perspective, rather than the morning perspective. If the detenser is right, then something is wrong about my thinking, for my earlier self thinks that he is viewing the world from the morning perspective, rather than the noon perspective. However (and this is crucial): my earlier self = my "current" self -- if I endure. There is only one "me" in the detenser's universe with endurance, but many times; and many of them have an equal right to represent my perspective -- the perspective from which I view the universe.

This fact about the detenser's universe with endurance is so close to the surface that it tends to go unnoticed, and there may be a temptation to dismiss the above reasoning as ignoring the well-known lessons of the "essential indexical" and the "knowledge argument" -- the issues to which Callender rightly draws attention in his discussion of the experience of the present (§9.3). If I call my Georgia colleague from Montana and say, "I am freezing here," and he replies, "I am getting roasted here," there is no corresponding problem about 'I' and 'here' -- the personal and the spatial dimensions of self-location. Why should there be a problem about the temporal dimension? I cannot go into details here; but very briefly: the "indexical" account of 'now' is correct and parallel to the corresponding accounts of 'here' and 'I'; no surprises here. But to make it work, the temporal dimension of self-location should be as fine-grained as the spatial and personal dimensions already are in the "block universe" of the detenser. It should be as fine-grained as the subjects of the corresponding self-location beliefs. But if things endure, it is not.

If things do not endure, the situation may be different. Or so it seems to me. Accordingly, I was anxious to trace Callender's thoughtful critique of the alleged "experience of presentness" to what I perceive to be its legitimate roots in the rejection of endurance. Unfortunately, my search returned a rather disappointing result: "I'm not a big fan of turning this conceptual distinction between endurantism and perdurantism into a metaphysical one, for I regard endurantism and perdurantism as two different ways of carving up the same exact world" (p. 248). I shall return to Callender's version of "metaphysical deflationism" below.

In the middle of Chapter 9, Callender branches out in a decidedly empirical direction, turning from metaphysics to psychology. The rest of the chapter and the next three chapters present a wealth of material from the psychology of time perception, with which every philosopher of time should become familiar. Callender's discussion revolves around the following question: how do our ideas of the manifest present and time flow arise from our complex interactions with the external world and amongst ourselves? "Our brains are under siege from a confusing and chaotic barrage of information about the internal and external worlds. . . . Many of these signals are then integrated together or judged to be simultaneous. How do we do that?" (p. 190)

Callender walks the reader through an amazing range of experimental results in psychology. They suggest that our brains perform a lot of re-calibrating work in the background, prior to our conscious awareness, by exploiting various "temporal integration" windows; adapting, erasing, and compensating for various time lags involved in perceptual processing; and using complex and still largely unknown neural mechanisms to allow us to synthesize the often incoherent and conflicting sensory input into coherent forms and make correct judgments about the temporal relations among salient macroscopic events.

Temporal integration works both within and across sensory modalities. The most striking and thoroughly studied cases deal with audio-visual integration where the incomparably faster propagation of the visual information from the source to the subject is compensated for by the much faster mechanical sound transduction, compared to the chemical photo-transduction, as well as by the shorter transmission time required for neural signals to travel from the auditory to the cerebral cortex. As a result,

it turns out that the horizons of simultaneity between light and sound in perception typically intersect at about 10 m from the subject. The huge difference in signal speed is more or less wiped out by [the above-noted differences in the speed of the sound- and photo-transduction, and in the neural propagation speed] when you're 10 m away from your friend. Indeed, in a sense it almost does too good a job, for typically people report signals as simultaneous when the audio lags a bit behind the visual. . . The brain gets it wrong -- the sound came much later -- to get it right, for typically those sorts of signals do originate from the same event (p. 191-192).

This remarkable tolerance of our brains to the asynchrony of the visual and audio information, along with "temporal ventriloquism" and other phenomena extensively studied by psychologists, neuroscientists, and cognitive scientists, cannot be ignored in philosophical discussions of time perception. The reader will benefit from the extensive exposure to the recent empirical research masterfully summarized by Callender in chapters 9-12.

Chapter 10 ("Stuck in the Common Now") raises two important questions: (i) Why do we share a "common now"? (ii) Why are we inclined to treat purely "egocentric" temporal categories (associated with our ascription of A-properties to events) as objective or "allocentric"? Answering the second question would go a long way towards recovering manifest time.

I said "two important questions" because I think they are distinct. Callender, however, tends to run them together. For example, he seems to switch from the first to the second when he says, in the same breath, "We tend to think of ourselves as sharing a common mind- and frame-independent now but aren't tempted by such a claim about the here. We think the now is objective when we talk about the present being what's truly real, what's truly happening, and so on" (p. 209). Let me start with the "common now." Building on important prior work by Butterfield (1984), Callender argues, very convincingly, that the time lags and windows involved in perceptual processing (see above) and in our communication do not prevent us from forming a solid notion of a common present in ordinary cases of observing and touching nearby objects, or hearing sounds produced by nearby sources, or communicating with nearby persons. In most such cases, the experiences we communicate to each other (and which we take to be occurring in our common present) are caused by objects and processes that change sufficiently slowly for our reports of them to be veridical and to fit properly in the margins created by the time lags of perception, communication, and so forth.

This success in sharing a common present also encourages us to stitch together and mistakenly extrapolate our local "present patches" to the entire universe. "The inter-subjective agreement leads to the idea that this 'global now' is objective" (p. 216). I find this claim rather puzzling if "objective" means more than just "inter-subjective." But I think that is what Callender intends. His goal in Chapter 10 (and the next chapter) is to explain the origin of our false belief that a particular moment of time is distinguished as being objectively present ("the present" of the manifest time), not just our tendency to agree on what is now the case. If so, the claim is problematic.

Imagine two common nows centered on some event in 2015, and on another event in 2018. Suppose, for simplicity, that each common now is stitched from the local "present patches" of the same participants. They agree that the 2015 event is present. This agreement is, in effect, a by-product of their communication exploiting various time lags, windows, etc. These individuals are also inclined to extrapolate their shared common present to the entire universe. But these same individuals are also involved in the 2018 event and agree that it is present (and are inclined to extrapolate that shared present to the whole universe). When everything is said and done, there seems to be a further and quite distinct question: why does the entire 2018 network of causal transactions (including the subjects' agreement on its presentness) seem to be happening, rather than the entire network of the corresponding transactions surrounding the 2015 event? Explaining the origin of the inter-subjective agreement in both cases does not, by itself, help to answer the second question. One gets an impression that one question is replaced with a different question.[5]

Chapter 11 ("The Flow of Time") advances Callender's Carnapian project further, by focusing on the second core element of manifest time. The leading role in explaining the origin of the illusion of time flow is assigned to the IGUS (for "information gathering and utilizing system") model, which is developed further in ways helping to make sense of the mechanism of ongoing temporal updating of its states. Although I am skeptical that Callender's excellent account of the common now developed in the previous chapter is sufficient to address the real puzzle of the distinguished present, I found his discussion of the "flow" aspect of manifest time very helpful, especially when it comes to the "specious present" and the role of memory in generating the illusion of "motion through time."

On the other hand, much of Callender's strategy in this chapter revolves around the "narrative conception" of the self which makes the "illusion of the enduring self" responsible for the time flow illusion:

What crawls up the worldline is not a substantial metaphysical entity, e.g., Weyl's moving spotlight, but rather the character in a kind of story. A narrative is being built up the worldline. At each moment, the main character in this story is being created from the resources at that time. You are always the leading edge of the story. . . With this understanding, we obtain a reason for our deep conviction that something is moving through time (p. 251).

This may provide one reason. Perhaps we wrongly think of ourselves as enduring through time, and this may help explain the illusion of our motion through it.[6] But if endurance is a wrong way of thinking about persistence, what is the right way? As already noted, Callender thinks this question may be empty. All he really needs is an illusion or rather the concept of endurance (p. 248). Here many readers will part ways with him. I count myself among them. In any case, I don't see how "narration" can solve any metaphysical problems.

Chapter 12 ("Explaining the Temporal Value Asymmetry") takes up the challenge of explaining another aspect of manifest time, the past/future asymmetry, which Callender now puts in a more precise form: "All else being equal, we tend to prefer past pain (future pleasure) to future pain (past pleasure)" (p. 265). In the background of his discussion is Prior's famous "Thank goodness that's over" argument in favor of the tensed metaphysics of time. As one would expect, Callender rejects the argument. Reflecting on what is wrong with it leads him to develop a connection between the past/future value asymmetry and the "proximal/distant discounting asymmetry": "all else being equal, we tend to prefer distant future pain (proximal future pleasure) to proximal future pain (distant future pleasure)" (p. 265). Indeed, the connection may hold key to explaining the past/future asymmetry in a novel and empirically-informed way, again drawing on an active research program at the interface of psychology and biology. But we must leave the matter here.[7]

This brings us to Callender's meta-philosophical credo expressed in Chapter 13 ("Moving Past the ABCs of Time"). It begins with a glance at the recent history of analytic philosophy of time. The champions of this tradition will not find Callender's observations very flattering! Muddled in empty controversies, constrained by the poorly-chosen AB-vocabulary, and still preoccupied with language more than the world, contemporary analytic metaphysics is engaged in constructing and debating "increasingly byzantine models of time" almost completely detached from the real work on time done by physicists, psychologists and other scientists. And when it feels threatened by empirical progress, it seeks to protect itself from conflict by adding more layers of structure between itself and reality, reaching culmination in the abstract "science of existence," which serves to legitimize the dubious dilemma of "presentism" and "eternalism," and a lot more. "Naked existence doesn't cause anything" (p. 296). Arguing about it cuts no philosophical ice. Existence's "ontic voltage can't light the smallest bulb" (p. 300). Instead of pursuing these dead ends, philosophers should strive to "provide meta scientific perspectives that open doors to new possibilities for science" (p. 311).

Although this puts Callender in very good company, one gets an impression that we have seen it before. This impression may be reinforced by turning to pp. 295ff, where (to paraphrase Russell[8]) Callender, despite his very real interest in metaphysics, develops a verificationist-sounding attack on its theoretical character![9] One may feel inclined to respond by elaborating on good and bad ways of talking about existence learned from Quine and more recent metaontological debates, by praising the sheer beauty of abstract metaphysical theorizing which is so good at pushing the limits of logical space, and by pointing to other theoretical attractions that continue to draw students to analytic metaphysics, making it such fun. But a better strategy may be to take the challenges presented by Callender seriously and to engage his arguments.

I wholeheartedly recommend his new book to everyone interested in time and its puzzles.


Thanks to Craig Callender for the feedback on a draft.


Balashov, Yuri (2005), "Times of Our Lives: Negotiating the Presence of Experience," American Philosophical Quarterly 42: 295-309.

Balashov, Yuri (2017), "Time, Fission, Fusion: An Argument against the Block Universe with Endurance," Manuscrito 40 (1): 109-143.

Cameron, Ross (2015), The Moving Spotlight. Oxford University Press.

Phillips, Ian (ed). (2017), The Routledge Handbook of Philosophy of Temporal Experience. Routledge.

Prosser, Simon (2016), Experiencing Time. Oxford University Press, 2015.

Skow, Bradford (2015), Objective Becoming. Oxford University Press.

Sullivan, Meghan (2018), Time Biases. Oxford University Press

[1] See, in particular, Cameron 2015, Skow 2015, and Prosser 2016.

[2] See, e.g., Phillips 2017 and Sullivan 2018.

[3] A brief side note on Chapters 2-8: the reader will learn a lot of physics from them. But even those unfamiliar with the language of mathematical physics will get a general idea from the very useful introductions and summaries to every chapter, which will help them navigate throughout the rest of the book. Such readers should not be turned off by the somewhat unfriendly typographical appearance of some pages.

[4] For details, see Balashov 2017.

[5] If I am correct in my diagnosis, one may still wonder whether such a strategy is necessarily objectionable. Siding with the computer scientist Scott Aaronson, Callender thinks it is not. One starts with some "big Q questions." "Consideration of these leads to the smaller Q' questions. We begin asking why only the present seems real and end up answering smaller queries about the various physical, biological, and psychological facts that lead to a creature being stuck in a moment. . . Sometimes answering the Q' questions leads one to reflect on the big Q questions and see them as less interesting" (p. 312).

[6] Cf. Prosser 2016, Chapter 6, where he defends a similar view, but in a more serious metaphysical way. I don't think Prosser's strategy is successful.

[7] See also Sullivan 2018 for an interesting discussion of various time biases.

[8] In his famous response to Strawson on referring.

[9] Drawing a contrast between the contemporary metaphysics of time and cosmological theories of dark matter, Callender notes that while the latter "all have possible observations in mind," the former does not show any effort directed at "finding observational consequences" (p. 295). I doubt Callender subscribes to the positivist account of meaning, so this may just be a matter of rhetorical emphasis.