What Makes Us Moral?: On the Capacities and Conditions for Being Moral

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Bert Musschenga and Anton van Harskamp (eds.), What Makes Us Moral?: On the Capacities and Conditions for Being Moral, Springer, 2013, 352pp., $179.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789400763425.

Reviewed by Elise Springer, Wesleyan University


This volume emerges from a 2011 interdisciplinary conference held in Amsterdam by the same name (sans subtitle). Philosophy is well represented in it, and Bert Musschenga provides the introduction. Anton van Harskamp works in anthropology and religion; additional contributions come from the above fields as well as economics, neuroscience, psychology, and literature.

The editors have sifted through over fifty conference papers to focus on 18, yet these still vary in their depth and value. Especially given its prohibitive price, few individuals will find this collection worth purchasing. Yet some institutions will be generous enough to make it available, at least in electronic form, and there are contributions worth reading closely.

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The title itself calls for commentary, and not just because readers encounter it on the cover. This question -- "What Makes Us Moral?" -- prompted and organized all the conference work gathered here. It was clearly designed to draw myriad responses. Given the question, I'm surprised that certain familiar "answers" (Oxytocin! Mirror neurons! Finding a dime in a phone booth!) do not appear here. Yet the very framing of this question is not neutral; it subtly discourages or forecloses some lines of thought even while encouraging others.

In his Introduction, Musschenga explains that the question departs deliberately from the skeptical challenge, "Why Be Moral?" Instead of asking for a justification for morality -- as if from outside of it -- he advocates speaking from inside of an existing relation to morality. From inside, we can ask things like: how do moral commitments emerge in practice, what capacities bring us to perceive situations in moral terms, what conditions (developmental, social, religious, historical) have fostered our moral capacities, and what conditions inhibit them? "What makes us moral?" is an insider's question, and parties to this conversation need not feign a disinterested stance.

Portraying ourselves as insiders to morality carries its own risks, however. First, such a title frames "us" as unproblematic exemplars of morality. To my ear, "What Makes Us Moral?" wants to sit on a shelf next to "Why I Am So Clever" and "Why I Write Such Good Books," echoing Nietzsche's hubris but without the requisite irony. Musschenga, meanwhile, offers a different title for comparison, suggesting that essays like "Why I am a Christian" deserve counterparts of the "Why I am Moral" variety (2). Despite my personal and professional commitment to better understanding and cultivating moral sensitivity and responsiveness, I cannot imagine wishing to write -- or to read -- such an essay. (Some reasons emerge below, but I also confess to a visceral aversion to the predicate "is moral" as applied to a person or group; it is as awkward as talk of someone being "medical" or "financial" or "aesthetic," and more misleading.)

Fortunately, most of the chapters steer clear of both apologia and outright hubris. Despite portraying "us" as moral insiders and sometimes substituting "humans" for "us" (14), Musschenga does not intend "being moral" to mean being morally ideal, nor does he think morality is human by definition; moral capacities come in multiple forms, and anyone can falter and fail at exercising them. Still, most contributors (Harry Wels and Adam Seligman aside) do follow his cue in the casual confidence that "we" know morality when we see it. They go on to ask what it is about moral action that makes it moral; what shapes moral habits, encodes moral traits, or prompts moral choice; and how to draw boundaries between paradigmatically moral beings and less clear cases, etc.

There's scant representation here of deeply critical traditions in ethics: feminism, critical race theory, radical ecological and post-humanist reflection, and so on. (The conference itself included other such contributions, but they are not included.) Authors working from an "outsider-within" standpoint (Collins 2003) would linger over the political contours of moral ideals and the uncanny history of how moralized identities become entwined with abject failures of sensitivity. Against the grain, they might ask, "What makes some of us think we're moral?" (Some chapters do challenge various righteous ways of begging the question about where morality might be found: presuming it is the home turf of theists, or of humans; presuming that it cannot be found in terrorists, or in SS officers. Yet they tend not to destabilize confidence about cases close to home.)

My point is not just that a writer should be skeptical about her own (or anyone's) membership among the moral ones. Rather, good roads are closed off simply by linking morality thematically to a "who" rather than a "when" or a "how." An alternative is to present morality as emerging through certain patterns or practices of social interaction. Participating more or less well in a moral process need not presuppose or constitute any coherent attribute ("being moral") on the part of individuals. Of course, given that morally tuned interactions emerge in some circumstances rather than others, individuals and their traits might be a site of relevant preconditions. Yet many background capacities and conditions for moral interaction might themselves turn out to be deeply relational phenomena. (For example, a presumptive individual trait like "empathy" may have little coherence insofar as it manifests only in socially-channeled, partial, and context-dependent ways.) If so, the title question should be interpreted so as to seem analogous not just to "What makes us bipeds?" or "What makes us digest food well?" but also to, "What makes us synchronize?"

The chapters following the introduction are bundled into five loose thematic parts. I'll follow roughly in order, pausing occasionally for discussion. Though most chapters are mentioned only in passing, I do not mean to impugn their merits; my comments simply coalesce around some themes rather than others.

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Part I, "Morality, Evolution and Rationality," comes closest to recapitulating the old "Why Be Moral?" debate. Three of its four chapters focus on reconciling morality (as represented by some emblematic cooperative behavior or stance) with accounts of rational choice and/or evolutionary fitness. (Ch 5, which speculates about measures of coherence among beliefs, is tangential and tenuous enough to leave aside here.)

Alejandro Rosas (Ch 2) argues that the "translucency" of others' intentions complicates Gauthier's reconstruction of how rational egoists come to cooperate. Instead, for "honest cues" to gain some currency, there must already be some agents with genuinely social preferences.

Katharine Browne (Ch 3) finds "Two Problems of Cooperation" playing out in parallel within evolutionary and rational-choice models of explanation. For the rational-choice problem, she defends Gauthier's "constrained dispositions" solution (to cooperate conditionally, in the game-theoretic sense), while cultural selection is favored to solve the parallel problem for evolutionary selection. She touches briefly on the moral difficulty that contractarians like Gauthier still face -- "failure to extend moral consideration to non-contracting parties" (47) -- and hopes that a good account of the "broadening of interests" can lead us beyond Gauthier's own solution of restricting the scope of morality.

Catherine Herfeld and Katrien Schaubroeck (Ch 4) ask a more lively question: How might economics, whose primary explanatory and predictive methods rely on rational choice theory, take account of moral motivation? Amartya Sen inspires them to take this problem seriously, but they find Sen's account of moral commitment to be mired in Kantian dualism (acting on interests versus choosing an act, even contrary to preference, "because it's right"). Taking a cue from Sen's idea of "ranking preference-rankings," they instead look to Harry Frankfurt to flesh out the idea of higher-order desires, and end up following his turn toward "what one cares about". Frankfurt's model is Humean in a broad sense: there is no faculty like reason revealing what in particular should matter to a person. Yet he describes how agents might identify with and bind themselves to certain projects rather than others. Cares, unlike desires, enjoy some temporal stability as they become associated with one's identity. Thus, "care" illustrates a powerful pattern of motivation that economists miss too easily in their shallow model of desires, interests, and preferences.

The Sen-Frankfurt contrast, Herfeld and Schaubroeck explain, animates a Kantian-Humean debate, and they champion the Humean side. "Cares," according to the authors, "are patterns of dispositions (e.g. expectations, desires, emotions) that are directed towards an ideal, person or object whose well-being or promotion one is non-instrumentally concerned about" (65). Such non-instrumental concern, however, still originates in the agent's own attitudes: "evaluative standards . . . are constituted in the agent's cares" (69) .Further, nothing in this account characterizes moral cares in particular. Stamp collecting may become part of one's very identity, but it need not involve being disturbed by a friend's indifference to philately. But then caring about human trafficking victims should be similarly disjoint from believing that anyone else should care about them. Herfeld and Schaubroeck resist this worry by being agnostic about whether moral motivation involves any special felt intensity or reflective criterion. For the sake of explaining and predicting social patterns, they only need "a picture upon which acting morally makes sense, not a picture that prescribes why everyone ought to act morally" (66).

Though Sen's notion of "commitment" may suggest a principle-bound and transcendent stance, this chapter's gloss on morality as "caring about" falls comparably flat on the Humean side. For something is amiss if moral care is untethered from caring whether others care. (Consider how, in Plato's Meno, any evidence of Pericles' lack of interest in teaching virtue would be evidence against his own virtue.) The communicative aspect of moral concern should be of interest to socio-economic research, and it is more than a simple contagion of desires. Indeed, even the word "care" suggests that we respond to something or someone -- the locus of care is apprehended as already there and calling for care (Kukla 2002). Hence care is a transaction realized in social encounters and relations (Noddings 1984), not just an individual variable that happens to influence observable behavior.

Yet this chapter illustrates a laudable ecumenical project: How can we talk about morality so that empirically-minded economists and normatively-invested agents stand a chance of recognizing a shared world of examples and trends? It's helpful to begin with an account of cares that run deeper than preferences. The development of such care, I propose to Herfeld and Schaubroeck, generally answers to a world beyond the self, a world crisscrossed by calls for concern and care. Philosophers and theorists of public and economic life should share an interest in how such calls get both made and taken up.

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Part II, "Morality and the Continuity Between Human and Nonhuman Primates" considers human morality in the broad context of social animals.

Florian Cova (Ch 7) hopes to clarify debates about non-human moral competence by clearly distinguishing moral agency from moral judgment. The argument is largely persuasive as to the possibility of moral agency without moral judgment. It leaves intact the assumption, however, that moral judgment (for those who practice it) hangs loose from moral agency, rather than serving as a complex development thereof.

Musschenga (Ch 6) analyzes "being" moral in terms of "having" a morality and outlines criteria for the latter. His criteria revolve around the recognition of moral rules (within several broad categories, persuasively articulated) and social disapproval of their violation. Many non-human species, he argues, genuinely do satisfy these criteria, hence they are deserving of respect (even if they do not meet conditions for being held responsible). Despite urging respect for some non-human animals, the overall effect of Musschenga's essay is to frame "morality" as a count-noun and to belabor the difference between having a morality and merely having a 'morality' (scare-quotes his). A presumption of mutual moral recognition among all humans structures the discussion, which simultaneously precludes any "we" that could bring human and non-human subjects into genuine moral relation.

Harry Wels (Ch 9) nicely addresses the assumptions that inform Musschenga's analysis, offering an imaginative and provocative exploration of empathy, embodiment, Deleuzean "becoming," and ethological methods. Complicating the disciplinary line between ethology and ethnography, Wels argues that empathy plays a similarly pivotal role in understanding wolves, elephants, monkeys, gorillas, chimpanzees, human beings, orangutans, dogs, and maize plants. Instead of contrasting the "human" with the "non-human," this essay animates a heterogeneous plurality of interactions, weaving reflections on human-human empathy together with reflections on empathy across species lines. Though Frans de Waal provides contemporary illustrations of empathy -- as both a theme and a method for primatology -- Wels credits an earlier cluster of pioneers – Jane Goodall, Dian Fossey, Biruté Galdikas, Masao Kawai, Barbara McClintock -- for radically unsettling Western masculine ideals of detachment in science.

The critical challenge for Wels is to respond to the charge of "anthropomorphism" as it affects the project of ethological empathy. This charge, Wels argues, should be traced "not so much to the anthropocentrism as to the logo-centrism in social-science research" (158). Only through an exclusive focus on texts and transcripts have ethnographers been able to marginalize the role of non-verbal sensory attunement in the understanding of other human beings. If our paradigm for understanding human others (across differences of "ethnos") hinges on writing ("graphy"), then the ambition to reach a comparably deep understanding of another species is confused. Since non-humans don't give us words that admit of being "written" down, they surely can't be understood as directly as human beings. So goes the underground logic of the complaint.

Yet to privilege writing is remarkably ethnocentric; and human speech, regardless of culture, communicates along dimensions left out by any transcript. Attunement to body language and other signs -- for all human beings during most of our species' time, and for most human beings even now -- makes for practical continuity as we develop familiarity within and across species. The practices of animal "tracking" exemplify such fully embodied and non-verbal forms of attunement. Those who are most adept at tracking, Wels argues, participate in what Deleuze and Guattari describe as "becoming Other." Crucial to this notion of "becoming" is its ever-incompleteness, as one "approaches" without ever arriving or "being" a fixed type. Not only do our own distinctive interests and embodiment continue to surface, but the animate "target" of understanding does not stay put for long, it too is always becoming.

When Wels "return[s] to the key question . . . 'What Makes Us Moral?'" he answers, "Certainly not the fact that we are human" (162). Indeed, he shifts the theme from the "who" that "is" moral to the work of constantly becoming morally responsive to difference.

Andrés Luco (Ch 8) calls for stern corrections. His project is to champion a "Humean" moral psychology on which beliefs and desires play distinct and complementary roles in motivating action. To explain an empathetic chimpanzee's action, for example, Luco recommends positing "a desire to meet the needs of a conspecific, and a belief about the means necessary to meet those needs" (140). Lining this Humean approach up against "anti-Humean" alternatives, he invokes criteria of explanatory parsimony and evolutionary continuity to reach a verdict favoring Hume. Specifically, Luco appeals to Morgan's Canon (usually deployed to resist human-animal continuity, awkwardly enough), finding there a strong presumption against ascribing human empathetic action to "higher" cognitive faculties if "lower" faculties (such as those available to a chimpanzee) suffice. Hence if one chimp's empathetic response to another is best explained by a belief-desire combination, then we should be skeptical about positing "higher" mechanisms for cooperative or empathetic human behavior. Very well, but why think that chimpanzee helping is best understood by the belief-plus-desire model? The climax of Luco's argument is this:

Anti-Humean mechanisms depend on a level of cognitive sophistication that is far beyond that of any nonhuman animal. As we saw, both desire-entailing beliefs and besires require an ability to make moral judgments . . . But nonhuman animals do not have moral concepts. (140)

Confusion has set in here with the conflation of multiple alternatives to Hume. There is one kind of anti-Humean cognition that cannot pass the evolutionary continuity test and which invokes the conceptual baggage of specialized moral judgment. Kantian representations of duty -- as Korsgaard (2009), for example, admits and indeed insists -- requires humans to break, in existential fashion, from more immanent and instinct-driven patterns of action-directed perception. So anti-Humeanism of a Kantian sort does not fare well by Luco's continuity criterion. However, Korsgaard's point is that the human aptitude for distinguishing belief and desire states is anomalous in animal life.

Some of Luco's targets, such as John McDowell and Margaret Little, are neither Humeans nor Kantians. McDowell draws inspiration from Aristotle, but other ways to resist Humean dualism derive from pragmatism, Gibsonian psychology, and phenomenology. Despite Little's argument that there is nothing "odd, or even unfamiliar" (Little 1997, 60) about desires and desire-entailing beliefs, Luco targets them with the argument from queerness: "Moreover, these anti-Humean motivations only motivate moral action. They are not necessary to explain non-moral actions like tying one's shoe." (147) This is a terrible misreading. McDowell's (1979) account of action-guiding perception places it squarely within the broader field of Aristotelian phronesis as well as Wittgenstein's reflections on "how to go on." Nothing is more like a "perception of salience" than noticing when one's shoes need tying.

Integrated perception-action psychologies, compared to Luco's bifurcated arrays of belief and desire, afford better continuity with our evolutionary cousins. Only a small subset of social species can afford a cognitive architecture of beliefs and desires, and even humans reserve it for certain tasks. (Hume himself, Little persuades us, is impressed by how inevitably our perceptions become "gilded" with projections of sentiment.)

Of course, the actions of an empathetic chimpanzee require no synthetic a priori reflection. Yet neither must we imagine a motivational fusion of cool beliefs and warm desires. The chimp needs only a certain practically salient perception: "Lo! What's needed here is (my) help." Similarly, gazelles see when to run, and McDowell's phronimos recognizes occasions for courage. Most human beings can suspend our fluent habits of response, disentangling cool observation from the lively sense of what ought to follow. Yet we do this work incompletely, and only insofar as we recognize occasions for critical questions.

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Part III is titled "Nativism and Non-Nativism," but extends pretty broadly to cover not just debates around innate moral tendencies but a variety of themes related to moral learning.

Jessy Giroux (Ch 10) advances the nativist argument that innate dispositions, even if they are not "specifically moral" in their origin or content, lead "normally constituted" people to develop basic moral principles such as those proposed by W. D. Ross.

Julia Hermann (Ch 12), by contrast, offers an experiential "knowing-how" account of moral competence, and defends it against Ryle's unwillingness to extend his account of skills to cover moral competences. While Hubert Dreyfus and Stuart Dreyfus do allow for moral skills, Hermann resists their assumption that rules are still needed as stepping-stones along the way toward more fluent stages of expertise. In conclusion, she writes, "The dominant rationalistic views overemphasize the role of moral principles, conscious deliberation, and theoretical moral knowledge. As moral persons, we have mastered moral practices." (221)

As Tessman (2005) argues, confidence about our own mastery is misplaced. The moral landscape is dilemmatic and ever-shaped by politics and history, so "being" moral and "having" virtue are precarious and incomplete. Would this admission undermine Hermann's analogy between moral competence and other skills? Do more concrete practices make failure transparent (and hence make warranted confidence possible) in ways that moral virtue must emulate? A humbler virtue ethics should not be attached to the confidence of mastery in either domain: with respect to technical skills, the assessment of our own skills may be subject to special temptations. Meanwhile, with moral skills, a tendency toward self-satisfaction is not inevitable. The norms and patterns of social practice can either encourage or discourage humility.

Carsten Fogh Nielsen (Ch 11) considers Poverty-of-the-Stimulus (POS) arguments for moral nativism in light of Kim Sterelny's critique, and concludes that adherents of nativism are guilty of overlooking the "complex and sophisticated" forms of moral learning experienced by an actively exploratory child. Without arguing that nativism is simply false, Nielsen questions whether the unfolding of various capacities, even if there are such, can possibly be considered exhaustive of what it means to be moral. Thus, Nielsen's view in practice approaches the "evo-devo" view, on which the very attempt to distinguish the contributions of nature and nurture are misguided.

Gerben Meynen (Ch 13) develops a detailed account of the respects in which mental disorders of various kinds can undermine moral responsibility. Interference with free will, the eruption of strong urges, the pull of false beliefs, and lack of moral sensitivity each (and especially in combination) endanger moral responsibility. What moral reflection urgently needs, however, is more than a legalistic "excuse" for those who clearly exhibit mental disorder. In interactions affected by clear mental disorders, what different kinds of moral mediation and translation are needed? Further, if the diversity of mental capacities resist a simple distinction between "ordered" and "disordered" minds, how might we respond well to these more graduated differences? Even if answers are elusive, raising such questions helps us resist the illusion of a neat line between members and non-members of the moral community.

Darcia Narvaez (Ch 14), in an essay deeply critical of contemporary trends in the US, emphasizes the importance of early responsive care, including secure relational attachments, in setting the stage for moral development. "Human morality is linked to neurohormonal, emotional and other biological functioning," she argues; "When these are deficient, virtue is hard to come by. Moveover, for any dynamic system, initial conditions are critical." (240) Narvaez's taxonomy of types of moral mindsets (safety, engagement, imagination) may strike philosophers as clinically artificial, and there is some romanticism in her description of small-band gatherer-hunters' practices as setting an evolutionary norm. Nonetheless, her eudaimonistic emphasis on developmental conditions helps to counteract the assumption that moral competence revolves directly around a set of moral principles and their associated judgments.

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Launching Part IV, Stephen Maitzen (Ch 15) argues that only atheists can be moral, since Anselmian perfectionists about God leave no real room for moral responsibility. It is indeed hard to see how moral burdens could weigh heavily on someone who thinks an all-powerful being ensures that everything -- at the end of the day -- is as right as it can be. Yet is it not uncharitable to read Anselm's doctrine into all discourses of God, such that only atheists (in any familiar sense) take morality seriously? Maitzen counters that any account of God that denies the classic perfections faces even worse logical pitfalls. Perhaps so. Yet if anything makes "us atheists" specially qualified for morality, it's surely not the habit of reducing religious devotion to doctrine; there are more things going on, when earthlings talk of heaven, than are dreamt of in Maitzen's argument.

Van Harskamp (Ch 16) weighs the arguments for thinking of terrorism primarily in moral, political, or religious terms, and persuasively argues for locating suicide terrorism within history (rather than as merely individual acts of moral monstrosity) and also within the context of religious martyrdom.

Bettine Siertsema (Ch 17) examines The Kindly Ones, a novel presented as the confessional autobiography of a former SS officer who urges readers to recognize how similar they in fact are to him. The appeal, Siertsema argues -- recalling Arendt -- is undercut by the narrative details of the account, which show, among other things, the kind of collectivist ideology that fosters a lack of genuine guilt.

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Part V has only two chapters. David Edward Rose (Ch 18) recommends Vico's "moral sociology," with its central and historicized role for imagination, as an alternative to "naturalisms" that begin with a pre-social conception of human nature.

Adam Seligman's essay (Ch 19) on ritual concludes the book with a breath of fresh air. Seligman presents ritual as a "propaedeutic to . . . moral action" (337), calling for participants to inhabit ambiguity and to "enact" the social world in ways that resist analysis as goal-driven conduct. Though Seligman does not explicitly address the early chapters on rational choice, he shows, in stark relief, what is most misleading about game-theoretical abstractions. In modeling agency as discrete choices, with each act indexed to one individual at a single instant, these theoretical games obscure the continuous and socially shared character of activity. What Seligman calls ritual, to be clear, is not merely a religious phenomenon (making "Morality Beyond Naturalism" an awkward heading for Part V). Though Seligman speaks from the Jewish tradition, Confucians, too, recognize ritual as a basso continuo practice of social coordination (Angle 2009). Rituals shape joint attention, foster relational familiarity, and afford ample non-strategic occasions for the "mind-reading" fluency that game theory portrays us as suddenly needing at isolated moments of choice. In cooking together, singing together, harvesting together, and jumping rope together (for example), there could be such a thing as "defecting" (leaving others "holding the bag") at any moment, but the temporally continuous and extended nature of the practice, and its weaving together of material and aesthetic interests, takes the connotation of sudden spoils away from the concept of "cheating." Of course, a relationship forged through ritual is not immune to betrayal; yet practical immersion in such activity grounds our sense of the difference between being "in this together" and merely "going through the motions."

A conference such as this one has potential strengths that do not cross over easily into a book. Beyond the chance to initiate dialogue, participants witness unexpected exchanges among other participants. It would have been fascinating to hear economists discuss moral motivation together with a post-humanist phenomenologist, or to hear how anthropologists respond to neuroscientists' speculation about patterns of coherence among moral beliefs. Though most of the essays are decent contributions to a certain field or subfield, a few of them exemplify short interdisciplinary projects of the kind that such a conference is uniquely poised to showcase well: I take these to be Herfeld and Schaubroeck, Wels, and Seligman. These essays reward readers not by answering the volume's title question, but by helping us reframe it.


Angle, Stephen C. Sagehood: The Contemporary Significance of Neo-Confucian Philosophy (Oxford University Press, 2009).

Collins, Patricia Hill. 2003. "Learning from the Outsider Within: The Sociological Significance of Black Feminist Thought" in Harding, ed., The Feminist Standpoint Theory Reader (New York: Routledge), 103-126.

Korsgaard, Christine M. 2009. Self-Constitution: Agency, Identity, and Integrity (Oxford University Press).

Kukla, Rebecca. 2002. "The ontology and temporality of conscience" in Continental Philosophy Review v. 35 p. 1-34.

Little, Margaret Olivia. 1997. "Virtue as Knowledge: Objections from the Philosophy of Mind," Noûs 31:1, 59-79.

McDowell, John. 1979. "Virtue and Reason," Monist 62:3, 331-350.

Nietzsche, Friedrich. 1989. On the Genealogy of Morals with Ecce Homo (Vintage).

Noddings, Nel. 1984. Caring: A Feminine Approach to Ethics and Moral Education (University of California Press).

Plato. 1981. "Meno" in Five Dialogues (Indianapolis: Hackett) p. 59-88.

Tessman, Lisa. 2005. Burdened Virtues: Virtue Ethics for Liberatory Struggles (Oxford University Press).