What Ought I to Do? Morality in Kant and Levinas

Placeholder book cover

Chalier, Catherine, What Ought I to Do? Morality in Kant and Levinas, translated by Jane Marie Todd, Cornell University Press, 2002, 208pp, $17.95 (pbk), ISBN 0801487943.

Reviewed by Adrian Peperzak, Loyola University


Catherine Chalier is known for several fine books that demonstrate her familiarity with the philosophy of Emmanuel Levinas or develop his thought in relation to urgent questions of our time. A new book of hers that confronts Levinas with the greatest moral philosopher of modern history, with whom Levinas, despite radical differences, shares a deep affinity, is therefore particularly welcome, not only for a reassessment of Kant’s revolution, but also for a clarification of the questions and answers by which Levinas went beyond Kant’s ethical theory.

An ideal confrontation of two original thinkers would keep a perfect balance of critical distance and benevolent familiarity with regard to both authors, unless one of them is clearly superior to the other; but even then one should make both as strong as they can be, or at least as strong as they are in their best passages. Chalier pays much attention to Kant’s principles and arguments, which she explains respectfully. The roles of reason and sensibility, theoretical reason (the intellect) and practical reason (the will), goodness and happiness, ethics and religion, the other and me are discussed extensively before she compares Kant’s theses with Levinas’s fundamental ethics and criticizes them from the perspective of the latter. Her conclusion is that Levinas’s views in all respects are superior to those of Kant.

Is her comparison complete? It is cheap and vain to criticize a book for not asking and answering questions oneself deems important, but in this case the contrast between Kant and Levinas might have turned out somewhat different if Chalier had not bracketed (1) the role of concrete morals, which Kant extensively treats in the “The Doctrine of Right and of Virtue” of his Metaphysics of Sittlichkeit (1785), while Levinas never deals with “applied” ethics, and (2) the role history plays in Kant’s and Levinas’s more or less hopeful perspectives on the reality of moral life. Chalier refers only four times to Kant’s Metaphysics of Morals, and she does not seem very interested in the way Kant concretizes his formal imperatives by finding an appropriate content or “matter” for moral behavior, when he tests the maxims that are prompted by our (natural, universal, and inevitable) striving for happiness. Chalier’s understanding of Kant’s ethical theory does not seem to recognize the intimate union of his rational and purely formal imperative(s) with our natural, normal and as such innocent dynamism that aims at satisfaction, without which our will would not be able to do anything.

There are more topics about which this reader disagrees with Chalier’s presentation of Kant, but there are few places where he disagrees with her explanations of Levinas’s oeuvre.

Chalier’s book would have become exciting if she had challenged certain difficulties and unclarities that emerge from Levinas’s work by trying to give Kant a more challenging role vis-à-vis Levinas. For example, Chalier argues that Kant’s universal principles or laws “alienate” man (32), while Levinas’s appeal to the epiphany of the face is not a principle but a more profound living source (38). However, could Kant not argue against Levinas that the face, if it is indeed “naked,” as Levinas constantly emphasizes, is as universal as humans’ “humanness” (Menschheit) or “dignity” (Würde) which, according to Kant, must be respected and honored as an absolute “end in itself” transcending all values (Werte)? Another Kantian attack could start from the universal experience that people have of duties with regard to themselves, which Kant not only takes for granted, but also justifies on the basis of rationality, while it causes considerable problems for Levinas’s focus on the Other’s “emptying” and “denucleating” me as a being-for-the-Other.

Instead of a fight between Levinas and Kant, one could stage a more reconciliatory intrigue by strengthening and reformulating their partially hidden affinities and convergences, some of which Levinas repeatedly recognized. Such a drama would not lead to a synthesis, but it could foster an advancement of the search for an appropriate theory of the Good.

Chalier wrote a skillful book on Kant as seen from the standpoint of Levinas; what we still need is a book on Levinas from the (retrieved) perspective of Kant; or even better: a new stage of the ongoing search for an ethics beyond ethics.