What Should We Do with Our Brain?

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Catherine Malabou, What Should We Do with Our Brain?, Sebastian Rand (trans.), Fordham University Press, 2008, 104pp., $18.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823229536.

Reviewed by Pete Mandik, William Paterson University


There's little doubt of the increasing significance of the brain sciences for the rest of our contemporary culture, though there's much to explore about what this all amounts to. It is appropriate for the portions of the academy beyond the centers of neuroscientific activity to take note of and absorb the significance of the advances made about such a crucial literal part of each of us. Neuroscience has already received relatively widespread attention from philosophers, most notably from philosophers of mind and of science (though neuroethicists seem to be growing in number), well versed in the technical details of functional magnetic resonance imaging, dopamine, the lateral geniculate nucleus, and long-term potentiation. However, to my knowledge, the resultant philosophy produced by philosophers attending to the neurosciences has been overwhelmingly done in the tradition of analytic philosophy, a few references to Merleau-Ponty notwithstanding. The item under current scrutiny is not part of this neuroscience-influenced strand of contemporary analytic philosophy. The volume appears in Fordham University Press's series Perspectives in Continental Philosophy, is authored by a previous co-author of Derrida's, and has as one of its back-cover blurbs one from Žižek (which I cannot resist pointing out starts off like this: "As a rule, neuroscientists avoid two things like a vampire avoids garlic: any links to European metaphysics, political engagement, and reflection upon the social conditions which gave rise to their science"). What we have here, for better or for worse, is a piece of continental neurophilosophy.

What should we do with What Should We Do with Our Brain? For starters, let us not doubt that the titular question is a good one. The question does however admit of multiple readings, some of which hinge on how to take the 'should'. Reading it as asking a practical question renders it akin to "What should we do with our abs?" Closer, however, to Malabou's purposes is a reading more political, if not moral, making it more along the lines of "What should we do with our homeless?" Or closer to the actual question at hand: "What should we do with ourselves?" Malabou's answer may be summarized concisely in her own words: We should

refuse to be flexible individuals who combine a permanent control of the self with a capacity to self-modify at the whim of fluxes, transfers, and exchanges, for fear of explosion … To ask "What should we do with our brain?" is above all to visualize the possibility of saying no to an afflicting economic, political, and mediatic culture that celebrates only the triumph of flexibility, blessing obedient individuals who have no greater merit than that of knowing how to bow their heads with a smile. (pp. 78-79)

If that's the answer then, one might wonder, what's any of this got to do with brains? Couldn't someone who didn't even know we have brains nonetheless make such a moral/political recommendation? Malabou's answer arrives very close to the end of her 82-pages of main text. However, despite being a short journey, one nonetheless wonders if the destination really needed a route that took a detour through neuroscience.

The main intersection between neuroscience and Malabou's project has to do with the notion of plasticity. At the core of the notion under discussion is, as stated in a quotation Malabou provides from Richard Gregory's Oxford Companion to the Mind: "Plasticity in the nervous system means an alteration in structure or function brought about by development, experience, or injury." But in Malabou's hands, the notion of plasticity becomes even more, well, plastic. Going considerably beyond relatively non-controversial points of etymology, such as that "plasticity" is from the Greek "plassein" for "to mold," Malabou seeks to mine an association between "plasticity" and "plastique," that is, that moldable mixture of nitroglycerine and nitrocellulose also known as "plastic explosive":

The word plasticity thus unfolds its meaning between sculptural molding and deflagration, which is to say explosion. From this perspective, to talk about the plasticity of the brain means to see in it not only the creator and receiver of form but also an agency of disobedience to every constituted form, a refusal to submit to a model. (p. 6)

I must confess that I find a bit hard to swallow the suggestion that neuroscientific discourse is infected by a poetic association between "brain plasticity" and "plastic explosives." The "plastic" in "brain plasticity" doesn't mean "explosive." Not even the "plastic" in "plastic explosive" means "explosive." It's the "explosive" in "plastic explosive" that means "explosive."

I think that this connection of Malabou's between brains and bombs is relatively representative of the rest of the book. How seriously a reader is prepared to take these sorts of associative links is, I think, going to be pretty indicative of how seriously a reader will take the larger project of which they are a part. For some, the brain-bomb association may seem like a potentially enlightening metaphor, for others, this is just the sort of thing that will make one's brain explode.

I want to return to a question I posed earlier, namely, the one along the lines of "what's neuroscience got to do with it?" Of course one might here raise Humean worries about deriving "ought"s from "is"s given the descriptive content of the neurosciences and the normative content of the author's main question (and answer). But this is not my main lingering worry, since Malabou has the resources for addressing it, at least partially. She holds that at least some of what the neuroscientists have to say has normative content: that "any vision of the brain is necessarily political" (p. 52). I remain unconvinced. And I have serious doubts that this is the only reason the neuroscience is brought into the discussion. (As Malabou herself says: "We must acknowledge an enormous discrepancy between the descriptive and the prescriptive scope of neuroscientific discourses" (p. 67).) My lingering worry is that technical results from contemporary science are brought in to lend an air of authoritativeness to the points being urged (one of the key lessons that the Sokal hoax served to teach) and less to point out a genuinely fruitful application of natural scientific achievements to questions arising in the humanities.

One indicative portion concerns forays into the basic mechanisms of synaptic plasticity. Malabou provides discussions peppered with mention of cellular bodies, dendrites, axons, and the modulations of synaptic efficacy known as "long-term potentiation" and "long-term depression." Malabou discusses not just synaptic plasticity (modulational plasticity), but also developmental plasticity and reparative plasticity (including some brief discussion of how an emphasis on plasticity is not entirely universal within the neurosciences). But to what end? Malabou quotes neuroscientist Marc Jeannerod (who also provided the book's foreword) for one of the main points she wants to press into service: "We are dealing here with a mechanism of individuation that makes each brain a unique object despite its adherence to a common model" (p. 7). But did it really take a 21st century neuroscientist to advance the proposition that each individual is shaped into a unique being by a unique life history? Couldn't an ancient Greek or an 18th century European have said pretty much the same thing?

Another use to which Malabou puts neuroscience is not just to mine its findings for insight and authority but to also use neuroscience as a target for critique. She aims "to develop a critique of what we will call neuronal ideology" (p. 11). Malabou is worried about one of the darker implications of plasticity, and no, it's not explosiveness that's the aspect of concern, but instead, flexibility. That is, flexibility as in

flexibility on the job, of one's schedule (flex time, conversion), flexible factories … The problem is that these significations grasp only one of the semantic registers of plasticity: that of receiving form. To be flexible is to receive a form or impression, to be able to fold oneself, to take the fold, not to give it. To be docile, to not explode. Indeed, what flexibility lacks is the resource of giving form, the power to create, to invent or even to erase an impression, the power to style… . [M]ost of the time flexibility superimposes itself on plasticity, even in the midst of scientific discourses that take themselves to be describing it entirely "objectively." … The error is in thinking that neuronal man is simply a neuronal given and not also a political and ideological construction (including of the "neuronal" itself). One notes that many descriptions of plasticity are in fact unconscious justifications of a flexibility without limits. (pp. 12-13)

Further connecting plasticity to a critique of capitalism hinging on flexibility, Malabou writes:

Employability is synonymous with flexibility. We recall that flexibility, a management watchword since the seventies, means above all the possibility of instantly adapting productive apparatus and labor to the evolution of demand. It thus becomes, in a single stroke, a necessary quality of both managers and employees. If I insist on how close certain managerial discourses are to neuroscientific discourses, this is because it seems to me that the phenomenon called "brain plasticity" is in reality more often described in terms of an economy of flexibility. Indeed, the process of potentiation, which is the very basis of plasticity, is often presented simply as the possibility of increasing or decreasing performance… . Suppleness, the ability to bend, and docility thus appear to join together in constituting a new structural norm that functions immediately to exclude… . In effect, anyone who is not flexible deserves to disappear. (p. 46)

Malabou's concern with neuroscience as target is that it not be allowed to serve as a tool of a pernicious global capitalism. But what remains unclear, among other things, is how Malabou's concern with neuroscience as a source of insight (instead of a source of authority) really serves her, given that her central concern is to pose questions like the following.

Does brain plasticity, taken as a model, allow us to think a multiplicity of interactions in which the participants exercise transformative effects on one another through the demands of recognition, of non-denomination, and of liberty? Or must we claim, on the contrary, that, between determinism and polyvalence, brain plasticity constitutes the biological justification of a type of economic, political, and social organization in which all that matters is the result of action as such: efficacy, adaptability -- unfailing flexibility? (pp. 30-31)

There are lines of argument in Malabou's text that I neither understand individually nor as contributions to the text as a whole. One line of argument has to do with the way that political structures and managerial structures have both become more "neural," which includes an emphasis on connectivity and distribution and a de-emphasis on centrality and localization. It's lost on me how this metaphorical parallel between decentralized brain control in brains and decentralized control in states and corporations serves to support the author's favored answer to the titular question. The other line of argument has to with something I especially didn't follow: a claim of a resolution of the mind/body problem along Hegelian lines that involves a transition from the neuronal to the mental arising from a dialectical struggle between the two.

I think there have been, elsewhere in the literature, many fruitful intersections of neuroscience and philosophy. I think further that there is room for plenty more. I applaud Malabou for attempting to address the potential moral and political implications of "neuroscientific discourses." That is no doubt an important thing to do. But I must say that my overwhelming reaction to Malabou's book is negative and my reaction is largely due to the methodology therein employed. A critique of neuroscience should provide more historical and textual evidence of neuroscience's alleged missteps than this critique provides. And an application of neuroscience should be more careful than the present text to distinguish itself from a mere invocation of neuroscience designed to lend authoritative airs.