What Tends to Be: The Philosophy of Dispositional Modality

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Rani Lill Anjum and Stephen Mumford, What Tends to Be: The Philosophy of Dispositional Modality, Routledge, 2018, 157pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138541979.

Reviewed by Stathis Psillos and Stavros Ioannidis, University of Athens, Greece


There seems to be widespread agreement that there are two modal values: necessity and possibility. X is necessary if it is not possible that not-X; and Y is possible if it is not necessary that not-Y. In their path-breaking book, Rani Lill Anjum and Stephen Mumford defend the radical idea that there is a third modal value, weaker than necessity and stronger than possibility. This third value is dubbed 'dispositional modality' (DM) or 'tendency' and is taken to be an irreducible and sui generis worldly modality: "the modality that's everywhere" (5). The source of DM is the causal powers of particulars; hence, DM is constitutively involved in causation: "a cause tends or disposes towards its effect, and can sometimes succeed in producing it" (9). Accordingly, DM is involved in all causal processes, from fundamental physics to the social and moral realm. This "deeply tendential view" (11) of the metaphysics of nature is advanced as distinct from both extant neo-Aristotelian and Humean views. Its key feature is that there is neither pure contingency nor necessitation in nature.

The idea of DM has already been introduced by Anjum and Mumford in previous publications. However, not only does this book offer a systematic exposition of DM, it also uses it as a tool to address (and claim accounts for and solutions of) a number of central philosophical concepts and problems: causation, chance, the logic of conditionals, conditional probability, perception, inductive inference, ethics and the problem of free will.

Chapter 1 outlines the two basic planks of the deeply tendential view: the 'external principle of tendency' (there is no causal necessitation, period) and the 'internal principle of tendency' (the modal nature of the cause is internally tendential, meaning that the effect of a cause may be produced even if it is not necessitated but it may not be produced even if the conditions are right (18-19)). Chapter 2 offers a brief (and sketchy) narrative of possible historical predecessors of DM and attempts a diagnosis as to why DM has not been hitherto adopted even by friends of tendencies. In chapter 3, it is argued that powers come in various degrees of strength and they can even overdispose towards an outcome; yet, it is stressed that the degrees of strength should not be taken to be probabilities. Chapter 4 (co-authored with Fredrik Andersen) argues that since causation does not involve necessitation, there is no problem with causation in quantum mechanics. The main claim of chapter 5 is that realism about dispositions requires an intensional conditional. In chapter 6 Anjum and Mumford, joined by Johan Arnt Myrstad, outline a dispositional account of conditional probability. Chapter 7 argues that perception is a mutual manifestation between the perceiver and the object perceived. Chapter 8 turns to causal inference.  Anjum and Mumford argue that since tendencies may fail to produce their outcome, inductive inference cannot be certain and will only "tend to track the truth" (142). Finally, chapters 9 (co-authored with Svein Anders Noer Lie) and 10 are about value and the problem of free will. Their key point is that since causation does not require necessitation, one can be compatibilist about free will without being committed to determinism.

Let us now take a closer look at some of Anjum and Mumford's central arguments and contentions. As noted above, the two planks of DM are the 'external' and the 'internal' principles of tendency. Capitalising on earlier work, Anjum and Mumford argue that there is no causal necessitation, since if causes necessitate their effects, "it should be impossible to have the cause without the effect" (11). But it's possible that something might interfere with the cause and block the occurrence of the effect. So, while C typically causes E, C-plus-I might not cause E. Anjum and Mumford argue that a hallmark of necessitation is the so-called antecedent strengthening (AS) test, viz., if A necessitates B, then whenever A, then B, which they take it to mean that "if A-plus-φ, for any φ, then still B" (13). Alleged causal necessitation fails this test, so they argue there is no causal necessitation. Causes, however, do produce their effects. On their view, "The external principle has the implication that causes did not necessitate their effects even on the occasions where they succeeded in producing them" (11).

This claim, we think, makes mysterious how effects are produced when they are produced. But we shall come back to this worry. For the time being, two other worries take precedence. The first is that it is not clear what notion of possibility is involved in the claim that it is possible that something might interfere with the cause and block the effect. If it is allowed as possible that Morgana casts a spell, then this notion of possibility is too weak. If there is some restriction to possibility: a) it is not clear what this is; but b) if it is based on some idea of natural possibility which is itself based on dispositional modality (as is insinuated on 22-23), then the account is circular. The second worry is that A causally necessitates B means that A is (causally) sufficient for B. But then the AS-test is moot vis-à-vis causal necessitation. To see this (briefly), consider that a cause is (at least) an INUS-condition[1] for an effect. Hence, it is part of a cluster of factors which are jointly sufficient but typically unnecessary for the effect. It's not hard to see then that when there is an additive interference, one or more of the INUS-conditions either changes or get eliminated; hence, there is a different cause and (no surprise) the original effect does not follow.

The real bite of DM, what yields a 'deeply tendential' view, is the more radical 'internal principle of tendency' (17). Anjum and Mumford insist that though causes do not necessitate their effects, they nevertheless can produce them. When this happens, it is not simply a matter of contingency. When a piece of fine china falls, there are many possibilities besides its breaking (it may evaporate!), but Anjum and Mumford think that one of those possibilities (the breaking) is in some sense 'stronger' or 'more privileged' than others (4). Beware: this does not mean that this one possibility is more likely to happen; tendencies, we are told, should not to be understood in terms of probabilities. What privileges some of the infinitely many possibilities is that there are powers that tend towards them, where these tendencies (of the powers) are "real modal features that are stronger than mere possibilities" (20). As they put it, "Of all the infinite possibilities, only some of them are those towards which there are tendencies" (19). So, A causally produces B by having a tendency towards B, where this tendency is something more than mere possibility.

What's really striking is not that tendencies can produce without necessitating an effect, but rather that the effect may not happen, even if all "non-trivially right" conditions for it are present (18). They couldn't be more explicit: "With the internal principle, there is nothing that prevents the effect from occurring, but still, it need not occur, just because the modal feature of the cause is internally tendential" (18). This move seems to pile a new mystery on the old. But perhaps there is no mystery here. Anjum and Mumford seem to model the tendential view on the case of radioactive decay (19). But some caution is needed here. That a radioactive nucleus is unstable and will eventually decay by emitting a particle, transforming the nucleus into another nucleus, or into a lower energy state, does not mean that this nucleus has a tendency to decay. At any given time, an atom will be stable or will decay. What is true of the atom is that it has a probability e-At of remaining stable for an interval t (depending on the decay constant A). If we were to think of this case in terms of tendencies we would have to ascribe two conflicting tendencies to the atom: to decay and to remain stable.

Be that as it may, the result is that no causal sequence of events is determined -- not even mundane sequences like boiling an egg. Anjum and Mumford allow that particulars A and B have the same powers and are under exactly the same conditions, and hence they have exactly the same tendencies. Yet "it is possible that one does and one does not [manifest this tendency] -- not because of any external interference but because of the internal, dispositional nature of power" (19).

The motivation for the internal principle seems to be the thought that it shows that events can be caused without there being a sufficient reason for their occurrence: the tendency of A to cause B can never necessitate the occurrence of B; still it causes (produces) B when B does occur. But note the irony. On this view, every event has, after all, a cause -- a tendential one, but still a cause.

Though it seems tempting to think that Anjum and Mumford subscribe to generalised indeterminism, they confuse matters by drawing a distinction between deterministic and indeterministic tendencies: "Indeterministic propensities in exactly the same circumstances need not produce the same outcome, whereas deterministic propensities do" (62). But haven't we been told that things that possess the same deterministic propensities may behave differently in exactly the same circumstances? Such behaviour would be indistinguishable from what would result from indeterministic propensities. But then, we end up with a case of metaphysical underdetermination.

Take the law of inertia: a body with no net force acting on it will continue to move with uniform motion or remain at rest. If this results from a tendency of a body, then, on the tendential view, it is possible that without any external interference whatsoever, the tendency might fail to produce its outcome. Wouldn't then the internal principle imply that the tendency leads to the violation of the law it gives rise to?

Anjum and Mumford argue that although tendencies may have degrees of strength (they say that "a power that has such a degree is what we call a propensity" (56)), they should not be viewed in terms of probabilities, since tendencies, unlike probabilities, can overdispose. As they explain, "Overdisposing is where there is a stronger magnitude than what is minimally needed to bring about a particular effect" (50). For example, if a stone of a certain weight can break a particular window, a stone that weighs twice as much and is thrown towards the window, overdisposes towards its breaking. This leads to a main difference between tendencies and probabilities: in contrast to probabilities, which do not take values >1, the intensity of a tendency, precisely because of overdisposing, can be 'unbounded' (52).

If "tendencies are more fundamental than probabilities", and they "can ground the facts of probability" (56), what's the connection between the two? It's not clear. But there seems to be a deeper problem. Suppose there is a tendency A with the minimal strength required to bring about effect B. Anjum and Mumford argue that even then the probability of the effect given the cause is not 1. They actually argue that overdisposing (increasing the strength of the tendency) is a way to raise the probability of the effect happening, which might approach 1 but will never be 1 (57-58). Given this, it is totally unspecified what 'minimal strength' is. If 'A has the minimal strength required to bring about B' does not license the claim that the probability of B given A is 1, there is no way we can link tendencies with probabilities. For if the probability of the effect B given a sufficiently strong cause A is ≠1, then there is no fact of the matter about what this probability is -- it could be anywhere in (0,1). It couldn't even be okay to say that the probability of the outcome is more likely to happen than not (i.e. p>0.5), since, due to the nature of dispositional modality, nothing guarantees that it is more likely that a tendency will manifest itself than not.

The connection between probabilities and tendencies gets even more complicated, when Anjum and Mumford distinguish between non-probabilistic and probabilistic tendencies. Probabilistic tendencies are tendencies "towards a distribution within a whole that is constituted by results of a sequence of trials" (61). But consider a fair die; since only 6 outcomes are possible, there is something that is necessitated after all: that every throw of the die will result in one of the six possible outcomes. Anjum and Mumford deny this: in actual situations (as opposed to the idealised model) the die's probabilistic tendency does not require, nor does it guarantee, that only these 6 outcomes are possible. Since the die "might break apart, land in a crack" and so on (61), the disjunction (either 1 or 2 or 3 or 4 or 5 or 6) is not necessitated. Like the case of non-probabilistic tendencies, tendencies towards a distribution might fail to manifest themselves.

This account leaves unsettled how probabilities are fixed. Why assume that the die has any tendency towards a distribution, if any outcome is possible? Besides, given that to have a probabilistic tendency, for Anjum and Mumford, is to have multiple tendencies with mutually excluding manifestations (50), how many tendencies are there in a die? Only 6 or indefinitely many? It seems there is a genuine difficulty to go from an actual distribution to the actual probabilistic tendencies (and conversely).

Surprisingly, Anjum and Mumford say that radioactive decay is a non-probabilistic propensity: "There is only one manifestation type, which either occurs or not, so this is not a probabilistic propensity . . . because it doesn't tend towards multiple outcomes" (61). But coins have probabilistic propensities. What's the difference? In the coin case, it either lands heads or tails; in the atom case "it either decays or it doesn't" (ibid.).

Why does all this pan out in scientific methodology? Anjum and Mumford  argue that the existence of tendencies is the best explanation for both the extent to which the world is regular, and the extent to which every regularity can fail. But given the internal principle, Anjum and Mumford end up facing a version of the so-called Inference Problem for laws of nature: how can we infer from the worldly tendencies the behaviour of worldly things? It is the distinctive mark of the deep tendential view that the same tendencies are compatible with many different possible scenarios concerning the extent of regularity observed in the world. Conversely, it is not clear how we can have statistical evidence (136) for what tendencies there are in the world. "A tendency could be evident, for instance, in a raised incidence of some phenomenon, where the incidence is less than universal but detectably above levels of pure chance", Anjum and Mumford claim (136). But then again, given what has been said, a raised incidence of some phenomena is fully consistent with no relevant tendency since the latter might not lead (or might not have led) to the raised incidence. Once tendencies have been cut-off from worldly (probabilistic or universal) distributions, it's hard to re-connect them again. For all we know, 'less-than-universal' regularities (136) observed in the world might be attributed to pure luck. Similarly, scientific explanation cannot only rest on what tendencies are operating, but also on the brute fact that those tendencies succeed in producing their manifestations. Needless to say, on this view, all prediction (even based on tendencies with sufficient strength) should be made with fingers crossed.

This is an admirable book. Anjum and Mumford advance a novel philosophical thesis, they defend it with rigour and ingenuity and explore uncharted territories. Given that the map of the area is currently being drawn there are bound to be inaccuracies and infelicities. But that's the fate of all explorers, philosophical or otherwise. Despite our critical points, Anjum and Mumford have succeeded in producing a thorough, deep and challenging exploration of these metaphysical matters.

[1] “Insufficient but Necessary parts of a condition which is itself Unnecessary but Sufficient” for their effects (Mackie, J. L., 1965. “Causes and Conditions”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 12: 245–65.)