What the Body Commands: The Imperative Theory of Pain

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Colin Klein, What the Body Commands: The Imperative Theory of Pain, MIT Press, 2015, 210pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262029704.

Reviewed by Matthew Fulkerson, University of California, San Diego


In this book, Colin Klein offers a strikingly original theory of pain. He nicely combines a range of empirical data and careful argumentation to defend an austere, imperative view of pain. The view is intentionalist, holding that the phenomenal character of pain is fully explained by appeal to its content. Unlike other intentionalist views, Klein argues that the content of pain is not indicative -- it does not inform us of bodily damage, for instance -- but it is a standing command instructing us to act in specific ways to protect the body. This change in sensory mood, he argues, secures many advantages over descriptive and non-intentionalist alternatives.

The book can be roughly divided into three parts. In the first, Klein offers an argument for the imperative view by drawing a close connection between homeostatic signals and pains. In the second, he offers more specific proposals for understanding the content of pain, providing a sophisticated treatment of the semantics of pain imperatives. In the final part, he responds to various objections, often leading to important elaborations of the view.

The first part of the book makes a direct case for the imperative theory of pain. Klein argues that homeostatic signals -- signals that function to maintain balance in some key bodily parameter -- are best understood as imperatives, or commands to act in specific ways. For example, thirst is a command to drink that maintains water and salt balance. Hunger is a command to eat, etc. These signals are caused by a diversity of world-states (generally uninformative, flexible) and proscribe a single action type. Klein argues that pains are best understood as such homeostatic signals. Pain "clearly plays a role in protecting the physical integrity of the body" (32), and motivates a unified type of protective action, which usually leads to healing. In addition, he notes the broad physiological similarities between pain signaling and other homeostatic systems.

Expanding this argument, Klein makes a critical, and as he notes, controversial maneuver. Nearly all previous theorists about pain have taken it for granted that pains typically hurt, and have made some attempt to account for this property. (Klein alternates freely between "hurt," "feels bad," "painfulness," and "suffering" to pick out this target quality). Klein argues that, "suffering is not a feature of pain: it is a response to pain. This means that suffering is only contingently connected to pain, and hence that pains only contingently hurt and feel bad" (46-7). This distinction "makes imperativism more plausible" (47). This is because while painfulness has a rich phenomenal character that is deeply motivating and uncontroversially bad, "the primary motivating force of pain -- and the one that is wholly constitutive of pain on a pure imperativist account -- is simply a command from the body to protect the affected body part. Commands from the body do not intrinsically, essentially, or necessarily feel bad" (48). As he says, "This book is about pain, not suffering. I have no theory of suffering, no story about what sort of state is present when pains feel bad" (56). This position is bound to be worrisome for some, especially since the main difficulty facing descriptive intentionalist accounts of pain (not to mention most other views) has precisely been their ability to account for the painfulness of pains. Klein recognizes this potential worry and offers several arguments for distinguishing pain from painfulness.

The arguments are surprisingly brief. He argues that there can be dissociations between pains and painfulness (49-51), and that each can be manipulated independently from the other (51-52). Mild pains, he suggests, simply aren't painful, despite motivating bodily protection. Similarly, many painful states aren't pains. These examples are aided by the use of different terms to refer to the same quality. For instance, it seems clear that strong hunger feels bad but isn't a pain, but it's not clear that hunger feels bad in the same way that painful pains do. Still, Klein clearly thinks there are experiences that are painful and that aren't pains. He further supports the distinction with a couple of additional claims. First, he suggests that to deny the distinction requires implausibly treating all experiences that feel bad, like heartache, as pains (52-54). It's not exactly clear why this is so, especially since only a few pages earlier (p. 48) he himself notes that many experiences, like seeing leeches attached to your leg, can feel bad in a manner different from his target. Perhaps heartache is painful in the way seeing leeches is? Or some other way? Finally, Klein argues that we need the distinction because pains have a unified, distinctive phenomenology, whereas experiences that feel bad are heterogeneous (54-55). Pains, of course, are notoriously varied in their quality, and one might have thought painfulness was one of the few shared qualities among them. Ultimately, it's not clear these reasons actually tell one way or the other against composite views of pain (views that treat "pain" as typically composed of distinct aspects, one of which accounts for painfulness). After all, dissociation and independent variability can just as easily be invoked to reveal the constituents that form the composite.

In the second part, Klein gets into specifics. Imagine a general standing over a map, issuing commands. Directing herself to her defensive commander, she says: "Protect this bridge from infantry attack at all costs!" This is a standing command, in force until further notice and whether or not the bridge is actually under attack. This scenario captures the relevant features of Klein's imperativism. For pain, the authority issuing the commands is the body itself. The map is the body schema, picking out body parts as represented for action guidance. The nature of the attack captures pain quality: just as protecting a location from infantry will necessitate different actions than protecting against aerial assault, so too will protecting against burning, throbbing, and cutting generate distinct protective actions. The strength of the command (at all costs!) captures the intensity of pain, which correlates with pain's primary motivational strength. Klein offers a ranking function for imperatives as the best means of capturing the strength of the command. Finally, the agent is the defensive commander, in charge of protecting the affected bodily part. A schema for pain content captures these roles:

Schema PS: Keep B from E (with priority P)! (87)

Klein argues that PS fully captures felt pain location, pain quality, and pain intensity. To focus on one element here (we'll get back to E in a moment): B picks out the bodily location of the pain in the body schema. This location can be diffuse or extremely precise. The content of PS thus relies heavily on descriptive bodily contents. Klein believes embedding these locations in a command offers a better account of referred pains and phantom pains than does embedding in a descriptive content. This is because in a descriptive content, it would be false that I have a pain in my phantom limb or in the referred location. Since commands lack truth conditions, and we can be commanded to protect non-existent or random bodily locations, there is nothing false in a phantom limb pain. The false limb really does have a pain (which is not to say that it hurts, which again, is a completely different thing for Klein). Still, one might wonder how the command manages to somehow project the felt quality (which after all is just a command to protect the body part) out into the specified bodily location. Klein does not say much about this. Still, this is a rich part of the book, with many subtle maneuvers and interesting side discussions in related domains.

In the final part, Klein addresses various potential criticisms, including those posed by pain asymbolia and masochistic pleasures. He also returns to painfulness, suggesting (but not explicitly endorsing) possible accounts for why imperative pains typically hurt. The material here is especially interesting, and very often illuminates and builds upon earlier material.

Overall, this book presents a detailed case for the imperative view, with remarkable honesty about the difficulties it faces. Klein admirably emphasizes the biological role of pain in directing behavior, both to prevent further injury and to help coordinate recovery. He considers the full range of pain experience, from those caused by acute injuries, to the often neglected pains of recovery, to phantom limb and other pathological pains. The discussion is impressively broad, covering pain phenomenology, the motivating role of pain, the reason-giving force of pain, the badness of pain, and the connection between pains and other forms of suffering. Without question, it is required reading for anyone interested in understanding pain, and for anyone interested in novel empirically-informed approaches to understanding the mind.

That is not to say that everyone will be convinced. Klein's positions are unapologetically heterodox. At many points, he clearly indicates difficult problems for his view that are more easily solved by other views. These difficulties arise in part because he defends the most austere form of pain imperativism. Whereas other views combine descriptive representational contents or functional elements with an imperative, he defends an account of pain that uses only imperative content. Part of the attraction here must be the simplicity of the view compared to competitor views. Of course, when the subject is evolved biological systems, parsimony isn't always a reliable indicator of truth. In addition, the parsimony itself is misleading since it's secured in large part by offloading the explanatory burden onto other areas.

Ultimately, whether you're persuaded by Klein's account will depend a lot on your prior commitments. If you're not on board with strong intentionalism, there isn't any argument to support that foundational assumption. More importantly, if your primary interest in pain concerns understanding painfulness, the cursory discussion at the very end will be somewhat disappointing. Setting these foundational worries aside, the view faces other challenges.

Klein offers a detailed, realist account of the semantic contents of pain imperatives. And he makes clear that he believes this content (alone) explains both the phenomenology and primary motivating role of pain. Yet consider his summary of how the contents motivate: "Commands that motivate are those that are issued by a source that we accept as having the authority to direct our actions, and so whose commands give us certain reasons to act" (72). Because of his intentionalism, Klein's account of the motivating element requires the imperative content to do both the motivating work and explain the phenomenology. But to be motivating, imperatives require a lot of background machinery: conceptually rich imperative contents that are issued by a (minimal, conventional) authority and a rational agent to accept and act upon that content. While none of this machinery is part of the content, Klein argues that they form the background conditions against which imperatives get their motivational force. This is similar to when I tell my toddler to stop writing on the walls: she recognizes and accepts me as an authority, understands the content of my utterance, and acts accordingly. Commands like this require a substantial amount of background machinery to implement, and we are given almost no details about the sensory analogues of these natural language mechanisms.

This lack of detail matters, since many of Klein's arguments don't secure anything more than a merely instrumental reading of the view. For instance, he emphasizes the distinction between homeostatic signals and other sensory experiences. He argues that we should treat homeostatic signals as imperatives because they are best understood by appeal to the actions they motivate. Since pains share many features with homeostatic signals, we should treat them as imperatives too. The problem is that ordinary perceptual experiences, like hearing sharp noises, seeing bright lights, smelling awful smells, feeling disgusting textures, and tasting bitter tastes also all have affective and motivational force. They are all intrinsically motivating in ways that support our general health and well-being (like pains, helping us avoid potential injuries, but also helping us avoid pathogens and other dangers). The class of stimuli that elicit such motivational force are heterogeneous, and all connect with relatively unified actions. They can all therefore be appropriately described by an imperative. Smelling something awful commands us to avoid the odor source and engage in protective behaviors (like gaping); seeing bright lights commands us to look away and close our eyes. It seems then that any motivating state will thus have a useful imperative description. The instrumental reading of the proposal, however, is trivial. Klein needs something much stronger.

Laying my cards on the table, I think the most plausible view of pain's motivating role is that pains and other homeostatic signals, while often usefully described by commands, are implemented by sensory processes that are more complex than simple commands. As all parents of toddlers know, there is often a serious limitation to verbal commands. Thankfully, we have more effective ways to get what we want: we can offer rewards, issue punishments, and even physically compel compliance, through direct causal intervention. Klein thinks pains and homeostatic signals are best understood as purely verbal commands. Indeed, his intentionalism requires it. I think a more plausible alternative is that homeostatic signals and pains compel action directly, by (among other things) biasing motor responses, capturing attention, and rewarding compliance. These interventions strongly implicate a role for painfulness in securing appropriate pain responses. Pains perform their primary motivating function very often by hurting. This is especially clear when we consider pains that we know are false alarms. Many pains, like certain kinds of back pain or the pain of hot peppers, aren't really protecting us against damage. If pains were like verbal commands, we would simply reject their authority and they would go away. But pains aren't like that. Severe pains especially are impossible to ignore, even when we think they are issued in error.

Klein assumes that pain involves a unified signal that explains both how pain motivates and how it feels. The argument for this second claim is surprisingly sparse (occurring on 95-99). Pains are incredibly diverse in their felt quality, from throbbing to burning to aching. Klein introduces the parameter E into pain content to account for this. E picks out the specific kind of protective action one takes with respect to a pain: "The difference between the sharp acute pain when you touch a stove and the later particular dull ache as your burn heals is a difference in what you do to protect the area" (98). This move is unconvincing.

What evidence is there that the protective actions constitutive of the pain signal differ for an intense burning ache and a severe migraine as they occur in the front of my head? And what about pains like headache that don't seem to tell us what to do at all (how do we protect our heads from a migraine?). Klein thinks the commands are standing, so they remain in force even when I comply with them, but it's still not clear that every imaginable distinction in pain quality lines up with a unique protective action. When I get stung by a bee, most, if not all, of my immediate behavioral reactions are directed at how bad it feels. Indeed, if it didn't feel bad, I have no idea what behavior I should take. Pull out the stinger, I suppose. But is "pull out the stinger" part of the content of a bee sting? Clearly not, since an insulin injection can feel exactly the same. This means we'll need a less determinate command, like "protect from stinging." But the less determinate the command, the more difficulty the view will have with subtle differences in quality. I've been stung by a bee twice on my big toe; both felt different, with distinct combinations of itchy ache, burning, and sharp shooting pain. Did they command distinct protective actions? Did the several interacting qualities produce a single complex command, or were there three distinct commands overlapping? I'm having a difficult time imagining what these different actions could be. And consider pain qualities like throbbing. Klein thinks this throbbing involves an introspective awareness of more basic pain commands occurring over time. To feel a throbbing pain is to feel a non-throbbing pain constituted by a specific command coming and going with a specific frequency. This doesn't seem like an adequate description of throbbing pains.

The worry is that there are no constraints on the introduction of more specific protective actions. Just as we can freely describe any motivational state as a command, so too can we posit a fine-grained distinction in the action commanded whenever there is a difference in pain quality. In other words, the actions specified are theoretical posits that serve the theoretician's needs; they are not at all obvious from one's intuitive awareness of pain quality. Klein often emphasizes how uninformative pains are. This tells against rich descriptive contents according to which pains represent bodily damage. But it also tells against fine-grained protective contents according to which pains issue commands. It only takes one or two detailed pain descriptions to realize how implausible it is that each unique pain will be identical to a unique protective command. Most pains promote actions that are not obvious; and even if they command protective actions they are not nearly fine-grained enough to properly capture specific pain quality. This can make the application of the schema to especially difficult cases seem ad hoc. At one point, for example, Klein suggests that the imperative content of the pain of childbirth might be something about protecting the uterus (115). It's moves like this, along with the hefty starting assumptions, that convince me the austere imperative view will be an especially tough sell. Nevertheless, the book remains an exciting, well-executed addition to recent theorizing about pain, and I recommend it highly.


I am grateful to Jonathan Cohen, Murat Aydede, and Colin Klein for helpful feedback on this review.