What Things Do: Philosophical Reflections on Technology, Agency, and Design

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Peter-Paul Verbeek, What Things Do: Philosophical Reflections on Technology, Agency, and Design, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2005, 264 pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0271025395.

Reviewed by Albert Borgmann, University of Montana


Analytic philosophy is dominant at all the great universities in this country, but, as Jerry Fodor and Richard Rorty have recently observed, its research program has petered out, and its contributions to the national conversation have been negligible.[1] Philosophy of Technology is the mirror image of analytic philosophy. It's marginal within the profession. The Advisory Board of Brian Leiter's Philosophical Gourmet Report recognizes thirty-three specialties, but philosophy of technology is not among them; and you can scour the pages of Jobs for Philosophers and not find a call for a philosopher of technology.

At the same time, philosophy of technology has a recognizable history by now and continues to deal with fruitful and consequential issues; and although no sociologist of knowledge has cared to find out, it appears from the topics, the style, and the reception of its work that philosophy of technology has had some influence on the cultural conversations in this country. Peter-Paul Verbeek's book is both a helpful history and a fine instance of the vitality of philosophy of technology. Originally written in Dutch, it has been ably translated by Robert P. Crease.

The three parts of What Things Do reflect the three phases of philosophy of technology. The first is defined by the founding fathers of the discipline, Martin Heidegger and Jacques Ellul, and extends roughly from 1925 to 1955. It was followed by a fallow period of some twenty years. In the United States, philosophy of technology began as a self-conscious discipline in the early seventies, largely through the organizing efforts of Paul Durbin and Carl Mitcham. The most influential philosophers of this group have been Langdon Winner, Don Ihde, Kristin Shrader-Frechette, and Andrew Feenberg.

The second phase took philosophy of technology beyond its preparadigmatic jumble and established something like schools of thought and canonical texts. More broadly, it established "technology" as the, or at least as one, defining term of contemporary culture. This phase is now reaching its end and has been overlapping with the third generation that includes Verbeek. His book is a careful and critical discussion of his predecessors, and it develops an original program on the basis of those discussions.

Verbeek's chief concern is the relation between humans and the material culture, and this concern is in fact the distinctive and urgent enterprise of philosophy of technology. Verbeek takes as representatives of the first phase of philosophy technology Martin Heidegger, unsurprisingly, and Karl Jaspers, Heidegger's now largely neglected rival in postwar German philosophy. Jaspers is discussed first, and the discussion both provides a useful foil for Heidegger and suggests why Jaspers has been forgotten.

The general charge Verbeek levels at Japsers and Heidegger he calls "transcendentalism." It elevates necessary conditions or parts of the technological culture to sufficient conditions or to the putative whole of technology. Jaspers, in the prewar period of his work, complained about the rise of a dehumanizing mass culture. "His analysis," Verbeek says, "is a clear example of the transcendentalist manner of thinking elaborated in the introduction, which reduces technology to its conditions of possibility and then speaks of these conditions of possibility as if it were speaking about technology itself" (p. 23). After the war, Jaspers retreated to a milder position where technology is seen as an ensemble of neutral means and where the problem we are left with is how to get technology under control. Verbeek considers this approach no less transcendentalist.

For Heidegger, technology is the way being reveals itself in the modern era, or, put more generally, technology is for him the basic and pervasive character of the modern world. Technology in this sense is the framework that precedes and shapes everything we do, e.g., constructing a hydroelectric plant, and it discloses everything as a resource (as a "standing reserve" in the unfortunate translation that has become standard). Verbeek thinks Heidegger has things upside down. "His words reveal," Verbeek says, "that, for him, what is happening is not that the construction of an electrical generating plant has brought about the transformation of the Rhine into a standing-reserve, but rather the other way around -- that the unlocking of the Rhine as standing-reserve has brought about the construction of an electrical power plant in it" (p. 63). Consequently, "concrete, ontic technologies drop out of sight" (p. 62).

Verbeek finds Heidegger's earlier analysis in Being and Time of how tools and equipment reveal a world more helpful for an examination of how humans shape technology and technology shapes humans. "Only his early work," Verbeek says of Heidegger, "offers a connection, thinking forward, to answer the question of the role things play in the way in which reality can be present to human beings." And in his characteristically constructive way Verbeek adds: "I shall be building on these analyses for the remainder of this book" (p. 94).

In Part Two, dealing with the second phase of philosophy of technology, Verbeek discusses the work of Don Ihde, Bruno Latour, and this reviewer. Unlike Heidegger's global and epochal view of technology, Ihde's approach begins with a typology of human-technology-world relations that has become classic in philosophy of technology. The types result from different parsings of the general pattern of relations. In the (I-technology)-world relation, e.g., an instrument such as a pair of glasses becomes part of one's embodiment and permits a sharpened perception of the world.

In his later work, Ihde rounded out his pioneering distinctions into a pluralist and essentially affirmative view of technology, an outlook he festooned with deflationary attacks on unified theories and nostalgic laments. Of all the authors Verbeek discusses Ihde is the one with whom he shows the greatest affinity. At the same time, Verbeek realizes that our interactions with technology involve more than the hermeneutic relations that concern Ihde, and here again, Verbeek, rather than attacking Ihde for supposed one-sidedness, suggests a cooperative view -- Ihde deals with hermeneutic relations, the following two authors deal with existential relations, i.e., with the way in which technological artifacts inform our acting and living.

Latour's contribution to philosophy of technology is actor-network theory. The leading idea is the rejection of the modern subject-object distinction and the recognition that hybrids have always taken the place of simply human being and merely objective reality. What are acting are not human actors but "actants," the hybrids of human-world interactions. Actants interact in networks.

This ontological position is close to Verbeek's postphenomenology where subjects and objects "mutually constitute each other" (p. 129; see also pp. 112 and 163-64). Though Latour avoids Derrida's inexcusable density, his approach shares the French poststructuralist strategy of specious formalisms and provocation by redescription. Once the formalisms have been discarded and the redescriptions decoded, however, not much insight remains, and Verbeek, in spite of his ontological sympathies, rebukes Latour when he employs redescription extravagantly or polemically.

Verbeek concludes Part II with a fair and careful exposition of this reviewer's contribution to philosophy of technology. Here the basic idea is that technology exhibits a pattern or paradigm of taking up with reality -- contextual things are displaced by machineries that provide a commodity with initially beneficial but increasingly debilitating consequences. The antidote is a recovery of things that engage us fully and orient our lives -- focal things, secured in focal practices.

Though he accepts the notion of engagement, Verbeek thinks that technological devices can be engaging as well. Effort, he says, is not crucial to engagement; the experience of meaning is decisive, and technological devices can provide it as well as focal things. The apparent rejection of meaningful technological devices, not surprisingly, also takes this analysis of technology, as Verbeek sees it, "dangerously close to the alienation thesis that was criticized in the first part of this book" (p. 185).

In the concluding part, Verbeek employs the positions and concepts he has elaborated in the first two parts to sketch an original relation of humans and technological artifacts. He does so by examining rival proposals, and he finds that they lose the material and sensible presence of technological devices by concentrating on their functions or their significations. In either case there are functional equivalents (and in fact improved versions) that can serve as signs or perform functions so that the particular technological realization is incidental and temporary. The criteria a properly designed device has to meet are transparency (so the device can be understood) and engaging capacity (so its presence in our lives will be vigorous).

Verbeek's book instantiates what it proposes. It's a fine piece of craftsmanship, and a brief review like this can't do justice to the diligence of Verbeek's expositions, the aptness of his terminology, and the originality of his criticisms. As for shortcomings, there are two I want to mention briefly. Neither is damaging to the central concern of What Things Do.

The first concerns Verbeek's postphenomenological ontology. That humanity and reality interact and shape one another is a truism. Verbeek wants to get beyond that commonplace to a "more radical phenomenological perspective in which subject and object are not merely intertwined with each other but constitute each other" (112). That position either comes to a fairly straightforward realism or it is incoherent. For assume the constitution of a person is resolvable into its constituents, i.e., into its subjective and objective elements. Then we are back in some sort of realism. Or assume the constitution is not analyzable into its elements. Then it is invisible as a constitution and no longer properly so called.

Verbeek tends toward the former interpretation, and to avoid a more or less naive perspective he resorts to Kantian things-in-themselves as the anchors to objects and subjects (pp. 112 and 164). But there is nothing new or radical in this. Verbeek could simply drop what he himself calls "a transcendental construction" (p. 164) without any loss to his critiques or proposals.

The other critical issue concerns a limit more than a shortcoming of Verbeek's enterprise. Verbeek is correct in pointing out that technological devices can be engaging or at least support engagement with one's world. A CD player, Verbeek says

in most cases is more engaging than consumptive. Thanks to this device, people can involve themselves intensely with Bach's cello suites without going to the trouble to find a cellist and arrange a performance, or hear various interpretations of the "Well-Tempered Clavier" without having to attend concerts by all the great pianists (pp. 188-89).

The problem lies in the slide from "is more engaging" to "can involve themselves intensely." Yes, people can so involve themselves; it's important to point that out. But do they? What's the aggregate effect of all the devices at people's disposal? This is an empirical rather than transcendental question. And if the answer is depressing, as it surely is in the United States at least, why is it so? Is it not possible that to capture this gross effect of technology we need to resort to something like Heidegger's comprehensive characterization of technology?

Both of my critical points finally pivot on ethics. If a straightforward realism (though scientifically informed and focally oriented) is what we are left with, what do philosophers have to add to the analyses of human-world interactions that biologists, psychologists, sociologists, and economists have come up with? And who is to say that the way Americans typically use technological devices is depressing? Norms of moral excellence point us to the philosophical work that needs to be done.

Verbeek is in fact aware of these issues. "A philosophical analysis of the different forms that the relations between people and products can assume," he says, "cannot arrive at empirical conclusions about the relations that will actually arise" (233). And on the next page he adds: "Because products by definition coshape the existence and experiences of people, their design is unavoidably a moral activity (234)." More work needs to be done, and we can be confident that Verbeek and his generation will take it on.


[1] Jerry Fodor, "Water's Water Everywhere," London Review of Books, October 21, 2004, pp. 17-19. Richard Rorty, "How Many Grains Make a Heap?" ibid., January 20, 2005, pp 12-13.