What to Believe Now: Applying Epistemology to Contemporary Issues

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David Coady, What to Believe Now: Applying Epistemology to Contemporary Issues, Wiley-Blackwell, 2012, 212pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405199940.

Reviewed by Earl Conee, University of Rochester


This book implements an excellent idea. The idea is that applied epistemology is worth pursuing. Applied epistemology, like applied ethics, employs philosophical resources toward solving real-world problems. In fact, in David Coady's view applied epistemology is part of applied ethics. (23) Classification aside, if epistemological distinctions, methods or findings help with practical problems, then applied epistemology has good work to do.

A main thesis of the chapter "Epistemic Democracy" is that applying epistemology contributes to showing that democracy is epistemically valuable: voting in governmental elections is the most reliable way available to identify the governments that will promote the common good. (74) Coady proposes an interpretation of a vote for a candidate in a governmental election. A principal aim of the interpretation is to allow an application of Condorcet jury theorems to the voting. The intended conclusion is that the candidate receiving a majority of the votes has a higher probability than the others of promoting the common good. For the theorems to apply in defense of this conclusion, the voters must be affirming some one statement about the common good. Coady proposes that a vote affirms this statement: the selected candidate is the best available for a job that is defined to be principally concerned with promoting what is, for some relevant community, the common good. (72) It is likely that few voters have had precisely this thought about a candidate. But the statement is proposed as the public meaning of a vote, not as what each voter means by it. (71)

We need some positive evidence that a statement about a job furthering the common good is any sort of meaning of a vote. Coady asserts that voters, to some significant extent, understand this to be what their votes say. (71) Coady notes the popular view that by voting we have "a voice" that can "send a message." (63) The popular view leaves quite open what the voice says when it sends its message. Various notions of the common good are prevalent in philosophy, politics and elsewhere -- that common good as what is universally beneficial, as what is preponderantly beneficial, and as what is beneficial when the interests of all are appropriately aggregated. This prevalent variety makes it doubtful that any one sense of "the common good" is part of a message that all voters send. The other evidence cited on behalf of the alleged public meaning is only partially supportive. It is a study concluding that voters' views of the general economy predict their votes much better than views of their own economic conditions. (66) This conclusion supports the thought that, in deciding how to vote, advancing general economic prosperity is more influential than is advancing personal prosperity. That might reflect a concern specifically for a thriving economy without any general evaluation of the common good. Further efforts in applied epistemology would be needed to identify evidence, or techniques for finding it, in support of the specific claim that a vote makes the proposed statement.

The existence of another crucial empirical fact needs defense. The jury theorems apply only if the voters have some sufficient propensity to be correct about their statement. Minimally, the voting population must be, on average, more likely to be right than wrong about it. Coady acknowledges that his epistemic defense of democracy "requires voters who are reasonably well-informed." (77) What needs defense, for the sake of applying the theorems, is that the voters have some basis that makes them, at least on average, probably right about the best candidate for a job that is principally about promoting the community's common good. It is clearly a highly non-trivial proposition that voters have any such basis. Applied epistemology might be helpful. It might identify some test for determining whether voters have the relevant basis. This would be an impressive test. Checking the accuracy of voters' judgments about the best candidates and the common good seems to require having an independent way to determine these things. In any case, this work for applied epistemology in support of epistemic democracy remains undone.

A good deal of What To Believe Now is pleasantly unorthodox. One chapter defends a positive epistemic role for rumors. The chapter offers a lean account of the nature of rumors: they are communicated contents that meet two conditions: first they result from communicative transmission that has gone through multiple intermediary minds, and second, the contents have not been "officially endorsed", that is, they have not been endorsed by an institution that has significant local influence on what is believed. (96-97, 99-100) The chapter has very helpful things to say about accuracy-enhancing features that rumors, so characterized, tend to have. They tend to be passed along by people who have some prior knowledge of the topics of the propositions, who are known by those to whom the rumors are told, who can estimate the plausibility of a rumor and choose, in the interest of maintaining credibility, not to pass it on, and who can have independent sources confirming a rumor's accuracy. (90-91)

These features go some distance toward supporting a main thesis of the chapter: "[I]n general the fact that a proposition is rumored to be true is evidence in favor of its being true." (87) The accuracy-enhancing features do buttress that claim, if this is the thesis that "in general", that is, in the usual case, learning that a proposition is rumored is evidence for us that it is true. Being rumored, in conjunction with typical background information, might be evidence for the rumored content.

If instead the "in general" thesis is that our finding out that a proposition is rumored always gives us some evidence for its truth, just because it is rumored and apart from all contingent tendencies, then the thesis is more questionable. It does help this thesis to note, as Coady does, that being rumored in virtue of meeting his two conditions carries no implication that a rumored proposition is untrue, unreliably sourced, or unsupported. (99-102)

If non-reductionism about testimonial evidence is right and receiving testimony for a proposition is ipso facto getting some evidence for it, then rumors are some evidence because rumors are testimony. If reductionism is right and testimony has to earn a positive evidential status for us by our gaining good reason to give credence to the testimony, then being rumored seems insufficient on its own to be evidence for the content. Again, on Coady's account, that a proposition is rumored to be true requires only that it has been multiply passed along assertively and that it lacks official endorsement. To the extent that these two features have evidential significance, they seem to compete. The implication that a rumor has been asserted by multiple minds might seem to add some reason to believe it, though testimonial reductionists can point out that we need not have a reason to trust any of them. The implication that the content is not endorsed by any doxastically influential institution might seem to add some reason to doubt it, raising the suspicion that factors other than veracity led to its assertion. Coady observes that propositions that are rumored are of interest to those who communicate them, and he concurs with Tamotsu Shibutani that being plausible exerts selection pressure on the sustaining of a rumor. (92-93) Interesting plausible claims that are not officially endorsed can be spread around for reasons that are not truth-oriented. Any proportion of cases in which some such motive is primary seems possible. Our gaining positive evidence from any given rumor seems to depend on our evidence about why the rumor-mongers are spreading it and why no influential institution is endorsing it. If these contingencies affect whether or not being rumored counts for us as evidence, then that status is not built into the nature of a rumor.

Additionally, Coady's account of the nature of rumors is deficient. For a proposition to be rumored requires more epistemic concealment from the rumor recipient than a lack of institutional endorsement. Suppose that I see you look out the window, and you tell me that you see that your friend Jones has arrived. I tell Rene that Jones has arrived and that you saw him and he is your friend, and Rene tells Sally all of this. The proposition that Jones has arrived has been passed along to Sally through multiple minds and it has not been officially endorsed. But the proposition is not rumored to Sally. In an ordinary instance of such an episode, Sally would thereby come to know that Jones has arrived. Yet receiving a proposition like this as a rumor is never a way to learn its truth, even if it does give some evidence for the proposition. It seems to be a further requirement of being told a rumor that the epistemic credentials of its origin, and any corroboration of it during transmission, must not be justified for the recipient.

The chapter "Conspiracy Theories and Conspiracy Theorists" is a vigorous defense of both. A sketch is given of the nature of a conspiracy: it is a secret plan by a group of people involving active deception, and perhaps the objective of which must also be morally suspect or illegal. (114) The chapter's purposes do not require Coady to work out these details of the notion. Against allegations that successful conspiracies are either historically insignificant or extremely rare, Coady points to the existence of many uncontroversially successful conspiracies, from assassinations of major political figures to assorted private criminal endeavors. (112-113) Coady makes a credible case that those who postulate political conspiracies are frequently subjected to unjustified verbal abuse by pejorative uses of "conspiracy theorist." (123-127) In response to this effort, which he describes as a "witch hunt", Coady suggests a need to popularize a competing pejorative. (127) He proposes "coincidence theorist" for someone who denies conspiracies despite "striking correlations." (127)

Coady seeks to illustrate the influence of coincidence theory in popular culture by citing an example of something that is now known to have been a conspiracy, where earlier allegation of the conspiracy was effectively disparaged as conspiracy theorizing. (127) We shall see that the intended illustration fails. The existence of the conspiracy could not be known in the way that Coady describes. This failure can serve as a cautionary illustration of the danger of incautious attribution, a danger that applied epistemology should give us reason to avert.

Coady cites "the theory that terror alerts in the United States were manipulated for domestic political advantage by the Bush administration." (127) This theory was suggested by Howard Dean, who a Bush spokesperson subsequently disparaged as a "bizarre conspiracy theorist," and John Kerry denounced the theory. (127-128)

Coady claims, "Now we know that Dean's conspiracy theory is true. Tom Ridge, Former Homeland Security Secretary, has admitted that the Bush administration manipulated the system for domestic political advantage." (p. 128) Coady's reference for this Ridge admission is not to a quote from Ridge. The reference is to a blog posting by Paul Bedard which contains no Ridge quote or page reference. This indirect sourcing is unfortunate. As we shall see, in all likelihood seeking a direct quote would have prevented using this example.

Additionally, the blog posting itself does not say or imply that the theory is true or that Ridge made any such admission. Bedard's blog says that Ridge asserts in his memoir that he "was pushed to raise the security alert on the eve of President Bush's re-election, something he saw as politically motivated and worth resigning over." So the claim in the blog is only that according to Ridge he got a political "push" to change an alert level. This implies that politics entered into a deliberation about the alert level. It does not imply that there was any political manipulation of the alerts, as the theory asserts.

According to Ridge in the memoir (chapter 14, "The Politics of Terrorism, Part 2," from The Test of Our Times (St. Martin's Press, 2009)), in the episode in question Department of Homeland Security people unanimously opposed raising the alert level and it was not raised at that time ("the whole idea of raising the level was dropped." (238-239)) Ridge does not admit or imply that the alert level was ever changed, or maintained, with some motivation to serve the Bush administration's political interests. Ridge makes no admission of any political manipulation of terror alert levels or of the system by which they were set. The one political intrusion that Ridge acknowledges is his making an announcement in which he gave President Bush credit for activities that resulted in gaining information that led to an alert change, an announcement Ridge reports subsequently regretting. (233-234) This acknowledges giving politically useful credit for the acquisition of what Ridge regarded as good reason to change the alert level. It does not acknowledge manipulating the level for a political purpose. Ridge elaborates on these things, to the same effect, in a Neal Conan NPR interview.

Do we at least have a milder version of the conspiracy theory confirmed by our having, as the blog asserts, an admission by Ridge of his having been subjected to resignation-worthy political pressure to change the threat level? We do not. The blog exaggerates Ridge's assertions. The closest Ridge comes to describing a political "push" for raising the alert level is his account of a meeting shortly before the election about the significance of the alert level of a newly released audio tape by Osama bin Laden. Ridge says that at the meeting John Ashcroft and Donald Rumsfeld "strongly urged" a raising of the threat level. (236-237) Ridge does not say in the book that he "saw" Ashcroft and Rumsfeld as politically motivated in their urging. Rather, Ridge describes himself as wondering, "Is this about security or politics?" (237) Ridge does not report anything from the meeting, beyond the "strong urging," that might suggest a political basis for the advocacy. In the NPR interview he denies that they were political motivated: "no one felt anything other than to make an honest judgment, a tough call based on security, not politics." Ridge also does not say that he considered the Ashcroft and Rumsfeld effort "worth resigning over." He reports having the thought, at some time before this meeting, "I knew I should plan to leave after the first of the year." (235) After describing the meeting and its outcome, Ridge says, "after that episode I knew I had to follow through on my plans to leave the federal government." (239) We can reasonably infer that his suspicion of political motivation bothered him. Perhaps it was the last straw. But Ridge does not say or imply that he thought it was an episode worth resigning over. He gives this as his basis for resignation: "it was simply time to go. After years of putting family matters aside, of not watching the clock, of reading intelligence reports until they appeared in my dreams, of running to the Hill every few days to satisfy members of Congress, of bearing a shared responsibility for the country's safety, it was time to let others bring new energy and vision to the effort." (240)

None of this enables us to know that the Dean conspiracy theory is untrue. It remains possible that Ridge himself participated in a covert manipulation of the threat level for Bush administration political gain. The memoir and interview could be part of his attempt to keep it secret. But evidence for any of that would have to come from elsewhere. Coady's unfortunate claim about the case is that we now know that this conspiracy theory is true from something that Ridge admitted in his book. We have seen that this claim is not true. The mishap confirms a time-honored lesson of applied epistemology: for any significant attribution, we should consult and cite the original source.

What To Believe Now defends provocative views on several other topics, including a denial that there are any moral experts (Chapter 2) and a backing of the accuracy of blogs in comparison to conventional news sources (Chapter 6). If the book encourages further work in applied epistemology, then it will have accomplished considerable good.